Setting the Moral Compass: Essays by Women Philosophers

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Calhoun, Cheshire (ed.), Setting the Moral Compass: Essays by Women Philosophers, Oxford University Press, 2004, 384pp (pbk), ISBN 0195154754.

Reviewed by Anita Superson, University of Kentucky


This superb collection contains nineteen, most newly published, papers by some of the leading women moral philosophers who have “set the moral compass” over the past few decades. The time has come for this book: I for one have found that the overwhelming majority of intriguing papers in moral philosophy have been written by women. What makes women’s works so interesting, evidenced by the papers in this volume, are (1) the issues with which women are largely concerned (e.g., self-respect, decency, resentment, and moral progress), (2) the approaches women take to philosophy (e.g., drawing on examples from literature and from real life rather than using wildly implausible, hypothetical cases, and respecting the history of philosophy while using it to teach new lessons applicable to real life), and (3) the theses women defend (e.g., that moral theories need to include treatment of vulnerable persons, that we need to assess not only the wrongdoings of individuals, but also the injustices of institutions, practices, and ideologies, and that in assessing the practices of other cultures we need to be sensitive to cultural differences while not succumbing to moral relativism). This is the first book I have seen that puts together papers for the reason that they are written by women philosophers, and as such it promises to confirm my own convictions about women’s philosophical work in the minds of its readers. The papers in this volume are not necessarily feminist papers: some explicitly are, but others are not identified as such by their authors. Cheshire Calhoun thinks of them in terms of a feminist continuum, ranging from papers with explicitly feminist aims, to papers that would not have been written in the same way had the authors lacked feminist sensibilities. I like to think of them as humanist papers, since they, together with earlier works by women moral philosophers, legitimize certain topics (e.g., killing in the heat of passion, genocide, the role of narrative in moral life), and either they explicitly aim to include traditionally disenfranchised groups, or the views they defend can be more inclusively applied than those typically espoused in traditional moral theories. Either way, they buttress feminists’ arguments for ending women’s oppression. Most significantly, this book is a unifier, not a divider. Typically we find works in moral philosophy written either by feminists (mostly women) or by those in more “mainstream” ethical theory (mostly men), with little or no overlap. This is unnecessarily divisive both for ethics and for women, since it sets aside feminism as a “special” area concerned with “women’s issues,” and generates expectations that all women philosophers (but only a few men) do feminism. But the fact of the matter is that feminism is concerned with some of the most fundamental issues in ethics (e.g., respect, equality, autonomy, and justice), and indeed, that any moral theory that fails to import these issues into its basic tenets in an inclusive way is seriously remiss. This division of areas often serves to marginalize feminism, and subsequently, feminists (mostly women) in the profession. This book, though, counteracts such unjust separations, since it shows that traditional ethics can be –indeed, should be– informed by feminism, and vice versa, in order for our principles and theories to reach their richest levels. All moral philosophy stands to benefit from this mutual exchange of ideas. Philosophy in general needs a lot more of this, and this book provides a great start. It is suitable to use in an upper division undergraduate or graduate course on ethics, and will be an inspiration to all women considering entering the profession of philosophy.

Calhoun’s introduction is simply outstanding. Significantly – and, I believe, courageously – Calhoun links the purpose of this collection to women’s status in the profession. She does not think that women philosophers produce a “woman’s moral philosophy” in a gender-essentialist sense. A gender-essentialist believes that just in virtue of their gender, philosophers will produce different kinds of work. This, of course, is false and sexist. But yet Calhoun believes that embodiment does make a difference to the philosophy one does.(12) This is because “our social worlds make all sorts of things of our evident sex differences.”(10) Our social world includes, for philosophers, our academic environment, where women have been notoriously under-represented. Calhoun believes that how women philosophers have been received into and supported by their profession affects both their subjectivity and their philosophical production. Indeed, not only women’s embodiment, but men’s too, will show up in their work, but, I would add, men’s philosophical production has been taken to be the norm, while women have had to work, without the support of numbers or high-ranking women colleagues, to legitimize certain issues, approaches, and theses. The point of Calhoun’s book is to make visible the difference that gender makes to one’s philosophical production, by allowing women philosophers, as philosophers rather than as feminists or as token spokespersons for all women philosophers, to have a voice. Very importantly, Calhoun notes that once we see the difference that gender makes in doing philosophy, it will be obvious that women’s under-representation is “a significant cognitive loss.”(12) I couldn’t agree more, and I would add that it would be a loss for our (male) colleagues to dismiss this book just because it is a collection of works by women philosophers, and/or because it contains representative feminist pieces. They most of all need to read it, since in virtue of their numbers they determine women’s being attracted to, and hired and retained in, philosophy.

The book is divided into six sections: an ethics for ordinary life and vulnerable persons (Marcia Homiak, Elizabeth Spelman, Virginia Held, Martha Nussbaum); what we ought to do for each other (Barbara Herman, Susan Wolf, Cheshire Calhoun); the normative importance of a shared social world (Margaret Walker, Claudia Card, Annette Baier); achieving adequate moral understandings (Robin Dillon, Marilyn Friedman, Alison Jaggar, Michele Moody-Adams); the dramatic and narrative form of deliberation and agency (Amelie Rorty, Diana Meyers); and emotions, reason, and unreason (Christine Korsgaard, Karen Jones, Marcia Baron). I am able to address only one representative paper in each section, tying it in with themes that Calhoun takes to be illustrative of women’s philosophy. Any moral philosopher would benefit from reading the other extremely rich, insightful, and interesting papers.

One common theme in women’s philosophy that takes many forms is resistance to elitism and inegalitarianism. Marcia Homiak persuasively argues that Aristotle’s arguments about the goodness of the moral life can reach not only those who are already disposed to virtue, but even the average person on the street. Homiak shows that the unimpeded activity of ordinary life is not that far removed from Aristotle’s ideal life of contemplation that seems to be in the reach of only a select few. She relies on an everyday case study of the ordinary activity (another theme in women’s philosophy) of art patronage, which is within almost anyone’s grasp. Art patronage involves continuous and pleasant activity of knowing about paintings, enjoyment from the mathematical skills involved in the business aspect of art, and contemplation with colleagues, all of which are marks of unimpeded activity. As a result of these ordinary activities and relationships, the art patron develops further desires for greater continuous activity, which eventually leads to virtue. In short, a person acquires more desires from pursuing certain things that the person on the street pursues, and these desires will eventually lead to virtue. Thus virtue, which is continuous activity, is within the scope of any rational being, and so Aristotle’s theory is not as elitist as we may have believed.

Another characteristic of women’s philosophy is the appeal to literature outside philosophy. Cheshire Calhoun, in a fun and exciting paper, examines the notion of common decency through the failure of Ebenezer Scrooge, who does his duty by giving others exactly what he owes, but who gives nothing more – no pleasantries, mercies, kindnesses, and favors that we expect of any minimally well-formed agent. Calhoun argues that common decencies are a subclass of supererogatory acts, the former being ones that are motivationally nontaxing (e.g., giving up one’s seat to an elderly person) and that are part of social convention (e.g., opening a door for a burdened stranger v. tying his shoe). My only concern about Calhoun’s argument is that if a person is being exploited (e.g., the severely underpaid professor), we should hope that the expectations of minimal decency (e.g., giving comments on students’ papers) become straightforward supererogatory acts. Calhoun could readily accept this modification by challenging the sexism and other immorality that might underlie social conventions and expectations generated thereby.

Margaret Walker’s paper is important for understanding the oppressed’s response to the privileged. It argues that resentment plays the role of targeting violations and prompting violators of our shared norms and expectations to reconsider their actions and to beware that they have violated these. This paper illustrates the themes of ordinariness and resistance to elitism: resentment is a common reaction of the oppressed to their oppressors, and it is a way that the oppressed can protest their ill-treatment and express the view that the privileged, but not the oppressed, have violated shared norms. Resentment responds to received threats to expectations based on presumably shared norms, and to threats to one’s standing to assert or insist upon these norms.(146) It is occasioned not only by harms and losses, but by exploitations (free-ridership), improprieties, demotions (of value), slights (treatment beneath one’s status), and offenses (norm-violations). In all cases the person resenting believes that the other could have acted differently, since the latter knows or ought to know that he is not exempt from the shared norms. Resentment calls for the resented to reaffirm their subscription to moral or other norms they have violated. And where these norms are different for the oppressed and the privileged, the oppressed can legitimately resent this very difference.

In her excellent and powerful paper, Robin Dillon argues that for Kant arrogance is the deadliest of moral vices.(192) Dillon approaches the issue of arrogance from a feminist perspective, setting up a dichotomy: should women use arrogance in struggling against domination, or should they eschew arrogance as a trait that conflicts with self-respect, as Kant believed? In so asking, Dillon demonstrates resistance to elitism, since even if arrogance might help women fight their oppression, it might be the case that they ought not to develop it if it means sacrificing self-respect – one is to have a humble attitude toward morality. Arrogance violates the duty to respect others, requiring that others respect the arrogant person more highly than he deserves, and that they respect themselves much less than they deserve, thereby denying their intrinsic dignity. Dillon identifies three versions of arrogance in Kant: (1) a warped belief that the worth of persons is scalar, and that nothing, including oneself, is unconditionally deserving of respect; (2) an unwarranted claim to much more moral merit than one has actually earned from acting morally; and (3) a belief in the greatness of one’s moral worth by failing to compare it with the standards of excellence set by the moral law. The third kind of arrogance underlies the first two, and is the worst form and the deepest source of evil, since it involves tinkering with the moral law in a way that makes the arrogant person able to pass off what he wants to do as what he ought to do, by subordinating the incentives of the moral law to those of the inclinations. He exercises power over morality and reason itself, for the desire for self-esteem.(209) I believe that this best explains the arrogance involved in privilege. Were women to become arrogant in this way, they would likely turn into oppressors themselves, and lose self-respect. They can, though, become superior to oppressive social norms, as long as they do so in a self-respecting way.

Diana Meyers’ insightful paper argues that any theory of moral agency must speak to the issue of internalized oppression, since this compromises self-determination. Agents who internalize their oppression act on their “own” values and preferences, but at the same time perpetuate their own oppression. Meyers rejects the Kantian view that so long as reason can steer volition, the agent’s will is free, since rational willing is not an option for those in the grips of internalized oppression.(297) Meyers rejects the Humean view that the only force that compromises free will is an external one, since agents who internalize oppression are not self-determining. She favors a narrative account of agency and responsibility that can show both how internalized oppression subverts self-determination, and how resistance is possible. When oppressed persons tell their life stories, they are empowered, are creative about what their futures can be, engage others for help in revising their self-narratives, become aware of habits that keep them from changing, and even change their desires and so rid themselves of internalized oppression. Meyers’ paper illustrates a resistance to elitism by acknowledging the very real presence of internalized oppression and by including even those who internalize their oppression as self-determining, full moral agents.

The book ends with Marcia Baron’s engaging paper on killing in the heat of passion. Significantly for woman’s philosophy, Baron points out that the provocation defense historically has been seen from the reasonable man’s perspective, being allowed when a husband observes his wife committing adultery, but not vice versa. Even though the defense is now available to women who kill their adulterous husbands, since women rarely kill their husbands for this reason, it is still gendered. Baron argues that the provocation defense is neither purely an excuse, since it suggests some degree of fault on the part of the “provoker,” nor purely a justification, since it suggests that the defendant’s agency is impaired by some provocation. Instead of rejecting this defense, which we might think that feminists should do, given its link with sexist background assumptions about blame, provocation, violence, gendered versions of what counts as acceptable expressions of rage, and so on, Baron argues instead for narrowing the defense. It can be used, after all, in cases such as the one in which a battered woman caught her husband about to rape their baby girl, and after hearing him later the same day threaten to rape the girl, shot him.(362) Baron argues for fine-tuning the defense in ways that speak to the extraordinary nature of the situation, and to whether there was taunting or arrogant flaunting on the part of the provoker or his friends. Using provocation as a hybrid of excuse and justification reflects our view that the defendant had every reason to be upset –there is nothing wrong with her– and that even very good people might react the way she or he did. Baron’s thought-provoking paper is a very fine example of philosophy that is informed both by tradition and by feminism, and shows how each stands to benefit from the other.