Sextus Empiricus: Against the Logicians

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Sextus Empiricus, Richard Bett (ed., tr.), Sextus Empiricus: Against the Logicians, Cambridge University Press, 2005, 207pp., $27.99 (pbk), ISBN 0521531950.

Reviewed by Harald Thorsrud, Agnes Scott College


R.G. Bury's 1935 Loeb translation of Against the Logicians is widely, if faintly, praised as serviceable.Thus Richard Bett's recent translation is a very welcome addition to the growing body of work on ancient skepticism.In addition to the fresh translation,[1] this volume contains a concise and informative introduction, and a useful chronological table situating the skeptics, both Pyrrhonian and Academic. A brief discussion of essential primary and secondary texts for those setting out on the study of Pyrrhonian skepticism, a glossary of key terms and names, and a listing of parallels with other works of Sextus also aid the reader.Perhaps the most useful feature is a detailed outline that elegantly reveals the structure of these convoluted books.Far more than serviceable, Bett's edition is an excellent resource for anyone interested in the history of skepticism.

Against the Logicians is part of a larger work that also contains, in its extant form, two books Against the Physicists, and one book Against the Ethicists. There were probably five books preceding these, offering a general overview of Pyrrhonian skepticism as well.The two books Against the Logicians are traditionally referred to as Adversus Mathematicos (= M) 7 and 8, on the basis of the mistaken assumption that they continue the first six books of M rather than belonging to a separate work.

Sextus opens the first book (hereafter M 7) with a brief discussion of the three standard divisions of philosophy in the Hellenistic period:logic, physics and ethics.This provides a useful, though crude, framework for organizing the history of Greek philosophy and more importantly, for setting out one's skeptical targets in a systematic way.As the story goes, most of the Presocratics cared only for the physical part, whereas Socrates cared only for the ethical, and Plato, Aristotle, Epicurus and the Stoics turned their attention to all three.

The Stoics were particularly fond of explaining the inter-relations between these three parts metaphorically -- e.g., ethics is the yolk, physics the white, and logic the shell.Although there is some disagreement about the relative positions of physics and ethics (cf. Diogenes Laeritus 7.40), logic plays a structural and defensive role in all the metaphors.It is, roughly, the study of inquiry and argument.It shows us how we may win truth for ourselves and then how we may defend the ground.And it is essential if we conceive of philosophy as the search for truth.

Sextus grants that this is the right way to think of philosophy, but unlike his doctrinaire opponents he is not convinced that the Logicians have established anything regarding inquiry and argument.In particular they have not adequately explained how we may ever reliably distinguish what is true from what is false (M 7), nor have they adequately explained the nature of truth, or what might signify or demonstrate it (M 8).To share his lack of conviction on these 'logical' topics is the purpose of the books.

This is consistent with his general skeptical practice of finding equally powerful arguments on both sides of an issue, so that the inclination to assent will disappear and tranquility might resume (Outlines of Pyrrhonism (= PH) 1.25-32).On at least six occasions in our text (M 7.25-6, and the passages Bett cites on xvii), Sextus reminds the reader that the purpose of the arguments he records is to bring us to the suspension of judgment (epochê).But he says nothing about tranquility (ataraxia) -- the closest we get is a reference to the disturbance (tarachê) that results from maintaining a Stoic view about the incorporeality of meaning (M 8.130).

We should not conclude that tranquility has fallen out of the picture.The numerous parallels between our text and PH 2 (Bett lists 78 in the appendix) indicate either that one is derived from the other, or that both derive from the same common source(s).In fact, the larger work from which our text comes, which Sextus refers to as the Skeptical Commentaries (PH 1.222, M 1.29), itself appears to be either a later or earlier version of the three books of PH.As the central role of tranquility is clear in PH, we may suppose the same is true of the Skeptical Commentaries.

Why then did Sextus produce two texts if they are aimed at the same goal and cover much of the same ground?On the basis of style and vocabulary, Karel Janacek argued for what is now considered the traditional view, that Sextus expanded PH 2-3 into the five books M 7-11 for pedagogical purposes.[2]Janacek believed the revised work was aimed at less advanced students who are in need of greater detail and illustration.

While it is true that M 7-8 is much longer than PH 2, Bett rightly points out that length does not necessarily indicate superiority.He also directs the reader to his earlier work for what strike me as convincing arguments against the reliability of style and vocabulary for determining chronology.[3]Contrary to Janacek, Bett argues that PH 2 is a more polished, concise and coherent revision of M 7-8."Indeed," he notes, "there is a diffuse, everything-but-the-kitchen-sink quality to much of Against the Logicians, which often makes it hard to keep track of the main thread of the discussion" (xxv) -- again, Bett's outline of the argument is extraordinarily helpful in this regard. PH 2, by contrast, exhibits a more clearly structured and cogent presentation of the arguments.Thus, Bett concludes with due caution that the superiority of PH 2 strongly favors the view that it is the later, cleaned-up version (xxviii).

Bett's judgment of superiority rests largely on two types of consideration.First there is the issue of the cogency of individual arguments.Second there is the issue of the unity of the texts, how the material is organized and presented.On Bett's view, Sextus decided that M 7-8 could be improved in both regards and so produced PH 2.Given Sextus' skeptical agenda in both texts, it follows that he himself must have thought these improvements would make it easier for his audience to suspend judgment on the issues discussed.But this seems unlikely.

The most cogent arguments are not always the most persuasive.It is apparently for this reason that Sextus allows that the skeptic will employ arguments of various degrees of plausibility.This is not to say that there is an objective scale of plausibility on which arguments may be placed, and on the basis of which we may say that one argument is an improvement over another.For the skeptic, one argument is better than another only insofar as it more effectively induces epochê.

Sextus' pharmacological metaphor is more fitting.

Just as doctors for bodily afflictions have remedies which differ in potency, and apply severe remedies to patients who are severely afflicted and milder remedies to those mildly afflicted, so Sceptics propound arguments which differ in strength. (PH 3.280)[4]

The strength in question is purely a matter of subjective plausibility; it is in no way an indication of truth, neither necessary nor sufficient.Indeed, it would not do for Sextus to subscribe to any of the logical criteria against which he argues in M 7-8.

In fact, Sextus concludes M 8 by arguing that the skeptic's attack on the logicians is not self-refuting, i.e. it does not commit him to the reliability of the very logical tools he wishes to discredit.Here we find another pharmacological metaphor:"just as purgatives after driving the fluids out of bodies eliminate themselves as well, so too the argument against demonstration, after doing away with all demonstration, can cancel itself as well" (M 8.480).Sextus claims neither to have shown that demonstration is possible nor that it is impossible, but rather that rational reflection on the subject leads to epochê.Whether or not the purgative metaphor works, it is clear that Sextus would not judge any argument superior to any other on logical grounds, that is, with reference to truth.

A similar objection applies to the second type of consideration, improvements in the organization of the texts.Sextus' intended audience might not be interested in discerning the overall structure of the text, or in grasping whatever connections there may be between the sections.Depending on the nature of the reader's 'affliction', he might need only to seek out some particular argument.In general, he need not start from the beginning and he need not reach the end for the text to serve its therapeutic purpose.Suppose, for example, that one has suspended judgment as to whether any clear or evident thing signifies something unclear, (as when the movement of the body is supposed to signify the existence of the soul, M 8.155).As he is not inclined to believe that such indicative signs exist, he need not seek out the counterbalancing force of Sextus' arguments to the contrary (M 8.161-299).Whatever structural role this long stretch of argument plays would be irrelevant. Thus, from a skeptical perspective, the improved organization of PH 2 can only be considered an improvement relative to the needs of the reader.

To stretch the metaphor a bit further, as long as they are equally effective, it doesn't matter which of two bottles of pills were produced earlier.This is not to deny the evident fact that one of the texts must have been written before the other (barring some odd method of simultaneous composition).The point is rather that Bett's judgment of superiority presupposes a disinterested, and perhaps even logical, perspective that Sextus probably would not share.And if Sextus would not agree about what constitutes an improvement in his work, we are hard pressed to claim that he revised his work in the hope of making such improvements.

Bett concludes his introduction with the following remark:

… to think of Against the Logicians as Sextus' first attempt in this area, rather than as his final word, does nothing to deprive it of historical and philosophical interest.But it may result in our regarding it, flaws included, in a somewhat different light. (xxx)

Although I agree with his assessment of the relative merits of these two works (from a non-skeptic's perspective), it would have been helpful to hear more about how this judgment should affect our reading of the text, especially as it appears to promote the same skeptical aims as PH 2.Perhaps we should conclude that PH 2 contains a more potent remedy for those with a more severe dogmatic affliction.But that could be used to support Janacek's contention that the later, expanded version of M 7-8 was produced for the sake of less advanced students suffering from milder afflictions.

Nevertheless, the many fine qualities of Bett's Against the Logicians make it an essential tool for the study of Pyrrhonian skepticism.Also, the sheer quantity of material quoted from other Greek philosophers in these books and preserved nowhere else secures its value for all students of Greek philosophy.

[1] The archaic tone of Bury's translation is particularly clear when dealing with verse.At one point, Sextus quotes from Euripides' Trojan Women 885-7 (M 7.128)."To see and know thee, who thou art, O Zeus/ Doth baffle wit! Art thou Necessity/ Of Nature?Or mankind's intelligence?/ Howbeit, I invoke thee."

Bett offers:"Whoever you are, hard to guess at or discern,/ Zeus, whether necessity of nature or mortal intellect,/ I pray to you."

My preference for Bett's plainer style may just be a matter of taste.But there are portions of Sextus' philosophical argument for which such plainness and clarity are instrumental for better comprehension.Overall, Bett's translation makes this difficult text far more accessible.

[2] Janacek, K., Prolegomena to Sextus Empiricus, Nakladem Palackeho University, 1948.

[3] Bett, R., Sextus Empiricus, Against the Ethicists, Clarendon Press, 1997, (the arguments are found in Appendix C).

[4] Translation by Annas and Barnes, Sextus Empiricus, Outlines of Scepticism, Cambridge University Press, 2000.