Shaping the Future: Nietzsche's New Regime of the Soul and Its Ascetic Practices

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Horst Hutter. Shaping the Future: Nietzsche's New Regime of the Soul and Its Ascetic Practices, Lexington Books, 2006, 222pp., $26.95 (pbk), ISBN 0739113593.

Reviewed by Jessica N. Berry, Georgia State University


Horst Hutter's latest book carries what should perhaps be treated as a warning to would-be reviewers. "Nietzsche's 'doctrines'," Hutter cautions:

constitute an overall synoptic vision which however would lose its sense entirely, if it were taken as a propositional system for dogmatic imitation or to be filed away in some comparative doxography. This is true also for any exposition of Nietzsche's teaching, including this particular one. (p. 53)

Applied to Nietzsche, the caveat is well-taken: Nietzsche himself is critical of "systematizers," and his writing is calculated to resist easy analysis. Hutter claims furthermore that, for Nietzsche, philosophy is an importantly didactic and not merely explanatory venture. What Nietzsche has to teach, he argues, must somehow be demonstrated or enacted in his texts and cannot be exhausted by any finite set of propositions. Hutter's addendum, however, that what is true of Nietzsche's writing is true also for expositions of Nietzsche's writing, guarantees that readers looking for precision beyond an "overall synoptic vision" will be deeply frustrated by the rhetoric of this book.

Shaping the Future argues that Nietzsche's diagnosis of decadence and slavishness begins with himself; that is to say, Nietzsche first accepts himself as a "Christian decadent," a condition that manifests itself physically and psychically (pp. 1, 6). His philosophical practice is thus oriented toward restoring health, for himself and for those he refers to as "free spirits" and "philosophers of the future." Hutter contends that one of the central ambitions of Nietzsche's life was to found a philosophical school to achieve this end (p. 4). In this respect, he believes, Nietzsche is deeply influenced by philosophers in antiquity: Nietzsche "wished to replace Plato and Socrates as philosophical legislators and thereby become the founder of new and post-Christian regimes of soul and political society" (p. 1). He has chiefly in mind such models as Plato's academy and the Epicurean garden (p. 4), though Hutter also entertains comparisons of Nietzsche to Jesus and the Buddha (p. 111). Not only does Nietzsche aspire to have the same sort of following, Hutter says, but he endorses methods for shaping future societies that are, like theirs, ascetic practices:

His books hence do not contain his philosophy but are instruments of philosophical striving meant to initiate ascetic labors of self-transformation in free-spirited readers and to provide the foundation for the creation of new values. (p. 5)

The first chapter defends Nietzsche's view of philosophy as a form of therapy, and the remaining chapters are dedicated to reconstructing each one of what is best described as the Friedrich Nietzsche Five-Step Program for Self-Overcoming (p. 25). The "ascetic labors" outlined under this program include (1) retreats into solitude, (2) the cultivation of challenging (even agonistic) friendships, (3) relentless self-scrutiny in the exercise of writing and reading, (4) close attention to "nutrition" (in an expansive sense that includes food as well as ideas and environmental stimuli of all sorts), and finally, (5) the physical activity of dance.

Overall, the therapeutic project Hutter attributes to Nietzsche falls into two phases, one deconstructive and one reconstructive: "his task involved first a conceptual effort to undo his and others' 'embodied' opinions and then to awaken the ability to move toward a vibrant 'healing culture' based on an affirmation of life" (p. 1). His texts are intended to recruit those whom he calls free spirits, but the task to which they are called is to become "commanders and legislators, [who] determine the whereto and the what--for all human beings" (p. 112, quoting Beyond Good and Evil 211). Success in this project promises "a responsible humanity" (p. 20), which will provide among other things the kind of stewardship that should ensure our collective survival and ultimately, it seems, benefit everyone. "In its reconstructive aspect, Nietzsche's teaching of eternal recurrence," for example, is "a counter-movement to nihilism by pointing beyond it to the principle of responsibility. The philosophers of the future must be 'artists' who use eternal recurrence as a tool for shaping the future history of humanity in the coming age of planetary control" (p. 204). Accepting this vision requires attributing to Nietzsche an interest not just in encouraging greatness in certain types of human beings, but in "redeeming humanity as a whole" through his "philosophical ministry" (pp. 60, 121). In Hutter's hands, Nietzsche thus "becomes one of the most 'altruistic' philosophical teachers"--a contentious claim that demands more independent support than it receives (p. 113).

Similarly contentious is the claim that Nietzsche, whose entire critical effort is oriented against the ascetic tendencies of conventional morality, actually recommends specific "ascetic labors." At first this sounds, as I imagine it is intended to sound, surprising and paradoxical. If it could be borne out persuasively, this ambitious and interesting conclusion would give us a radically new perspective on Nietzsche's thought. However, as these recommendations come into clearer focus, what emerges instead seems to be a worrisome equivocation on 'asceticism'. To use an example invited by Hutter's consideration of Nietzsche's remarks on nutrition: if I recognize that I am not in sound physical condition and aim to make myself more fit by adopting a rigorous program of diet and exercise, I will certainly find myself working very hard and resisting indulgence in activities and foods I formerly enjoyed. And until I begin to succeed in this program and get in better shape, it is likely that I will not find these new habits very pleasurable. But hard work in the service of a worthwhile goal, the improvement of my health, even if that work involves, as it were, blood, sweat and tears, is not the same as asceticism. Nor is the sort of self-denial involved in resisting the last piece of cheesecake what Nietzsche has in mind in his analysis of the priestly type who manages to tame and deny his body's most fundamental impulses; the latter is a case of genuine asceticism, the former is just simple prudence.

It is analytic to the concept of asceticism Nietzsche is concerned to criticize that its result is a general weakening, if not the destruction, of the organism that engages in the behavior. (It is important to keep in mind here that an organism can be sickened or weakened in Nietzsche's sense even as its feeling of power increases). If that is so, then successful efforts at health and self-improvement, even if painful, cannot be characterized as 'ascetic'; and if we cannot characterize these labors as ascetic, then Hutter's thesis loses its element of surprise. What is worse, Nietzsche would surely say that one of the greatest dangers for the types of human beings he addresses lies behind precisely this confusion; that is to say, if these latent higher and stronger types of human beings fail to distinguish suffering in the service of life-denying goals (asceticism) from suffering in the service of life-enhancing ones (prudence), they may be lured into ascetic practices that will ultimately cause them harm.

In the introductory sketch we have considered of Nietzsche's "conceptual effort to undo his and others' 'embodied' opinions and then to awaken the ability to move toward a vibrant 'healing culture'," and in the author's description of Nietzsche as "one of the most 'altruistic' philosophical teachers," the terms Hutter sets off in quotes belong to a list of terms marked for special use that grows to an impressive size just in the first few pages. He takes up the issue of Nietzsche's "enmity" toward the "idols" Plato and Socrates; the "slavish" natures of persons inhabiting liberal democracies (i.e., "last men"), and their "embodied" opinions about morality and the "beyond" posited by Christian metaphysics; he juxtaposes the sets of logically coherent and "true" opinions and doctrines about the world offered by conventional philosophies with the "true" and "false" "doctrines" with which Nietzsche "attempts" to "tempt" and heal "individuals" and establish a new regime of the soul. The "individuals" he addresses are not yet fully "persons," but still belong to "herds" or to the "many" as opposed to the "few" on whom Nietzsche's self-shaping program will be effective once his writings are "understood" and his "truths" grasped, both in the poetic works like Zarathustra and in the more "analytical" works like the Genealogy (pp. 1-3). Some of these terms are of course just Nietzsche's own ("idols," "herds"); in other cases Hutter's punctuation seems superfluous since he takes the meaning for granted ("analytical"). Many others, however, are given a semi-technical status and are discussed at length in Shaping the Future ("individuals," e.g., later to be contrasted with the fragmented selves or "dividuals" that are the products of decadent modern culture). These terms are meant to do important work in Hutter's analysis, but in spite of the extensive discussion of some of them, they retain their disquotational status to the very end, a strategy that effectively keeps the reader at a maddening distance from any settled meaning, even internal to Hutter's analysis. Referring to Nietzsche's penchant for irony, Hutter cautions that the "last thing" we should do with Nietzsche is to take him literally (p. 10), but in this respect the exegesis should not resemble its object. (Hutter later violates this maxim, in any event, insofar as his chapter on dancing requires that we take Nietzsche's remarks on dance not symbolically, not metaphorically, nor as poetic illustrations, but dead literally: "Nietzsche sees dance as one of the main tools for autopoiesis … " (pp. 25, 180-81).)

The most vexing instance of this problem concerns the important issue of "free will." Since the central theme of Shaping the Future is self-creation, Hutter is immediately confronted with what has come to be recognized as a particularly resistant tension in Nietzsche's work, where his exhortations about "giving style" to one's character seem to run up against his apparent denials that we have the freedom to do so. Much has been written on this problem (though none of that literature is engaged or even mentioned by the author), but it is far from settled decisively. The only hope of having it settled lies in a sophisticated and careful account of Nietzsche's view of the self and of freedom; but no such account is to be found in Shaping the Future. When Hutter attempts to say what he will mean by autopoiesis, he explains that creation of the self "is not ab nihilo, but is an arranging, embellishing, and shaping of what is received from the past… . It is by no means a 'free will', but is a freedom of choice between pre-given paths" (p. 15). Here, as elsewhere, 'free will' appears in quotation marks, to indicate that the reader is not to take it as he or she ordinarily might; i.e., as that which, among other things, makes (freedom of) choice possible. But to understand how we should take it really requires an analysis of the phenomenon of 'choosing' that makes sense of it independently of willing, and again that analysis is not offered.

The author's reluctance to drop the quotation marks in his discussions of free will is, I take it, the result of his quite correct estimation that according to Nietzsche, "A key aspect of the false consciousness governing the societies of the last man is the belief that individuals are responsible because they are endowed with free will" (p. 47). (This in spite of Hutter's insistence that the techniques Nietzsche prescribes are intended to produce individuals who are responsible for the future of humanity (pp. 20, 204, cited above).) While on Nietzsche's own view, "everything just happens unwilled: most human beings do not will, but are being willed. To be sure, individuals choose, but these choices are between pre-given and unchosen alternatives" (ibid.). If everything that happens happens unwilled, and if human actions are events that fall under the heading of 'everything', then we should say not that 'most human beings do not will', but that no humans will. And if that is the case, then it is difficult to understand the sense in which 'individuals choose' at all. Yet they must choose, in order for them to be able to follow successfully the program Hutter has Nietzsche prescribe. The explanation of autopoiesis offered here seems to require a certain degree of freedom, yet Hutter frequently describes human beings as if they are determined, causally and sufficiently, by external forces (p. 79). This is an absolutely vital tension in Shaping the Future, but since the concept of "free will" remains totally opaque, the tension is unresolved.

A similar problem troubles the equally essential concept of therapy in Shaping the Future. The centrality Hutter accords this concept, I think, places an entirely appropriate emphasis on Nietzsche as a psychologist. Nietzsche surely understood himself in this way--indeed, as "a psychologist without equal"--but in a philosophical climate that is mostly hostile to empirical psychology, this facet of Nietzsche's thought is too often downplayed. Appreciating properly the value Nietzsche himself places upon psychological insight, however, depends once again on our having grasped precisely what gains such insight should yield. What kinds of therapeutic methods and results does Hutter take Nietzsche to have in mind? At times, Hutter settles for characterizations of Nietzsche's therapeutic aims that verge dangerously on the contemporary jargon of pop-psychology: Nietzsche's texts are supposed to bring about "the dissolution of the various automatic ego tyrannies now ensconced in the self-structures of so many modern individuals" (p. 48). This is difficult work, however, because our "ego illusions entrap [our] actions in a self-defeating spiral" (p. 56). Other times, the diagnosis Nietzsche offers sounds Marxist in spirit: an obstacle to practicing the solitude Nietzsche would recommend is that the

culture of entertainment thrives on creating and exploiting boredom which functions as a defense against solitude… . A person completely caught up in frenetic entertainment will then almost certainly not see any possibilities or any need for self-change. (p. 48, see also p. 204-05)

And in fact, Hutter acknowledges Nietzsche's indebtedness to a long tradition of philosophers who "have proclaimed various endings of both culture as a whole as well as of philosophy itself," and who became determined to change the world, the "most conspicuous" of whom is Marx (p. 180). The Marxist and the pop-psychologist surely differ, however, not only in matters of rhetorical style but also in degrees of philosophical sophistication. More of an attempt needs to be made to distinguish their methodological commitments, and to clarify whether and in what ways Nietzsche's commitments resemble theirs.

One quite promising possibility for understanding the notion of therapy in Shaping the Future, given the link Hutter would like to forge between Nietzsche and his predecessors in antiquity, would involve reading Nietzsche as a eudaimonist. It is unfortunate that eudaimonism as such gets no discussion here, but that in itself is symptomatic of one final, though critical, shortcoming of this book. From the first page, Hutter makes bold claims about the importance of the Greeks for Nietzsche. However, his exegesis does not provide a full enough picture of the ancients to whom Nietzsche is supposedly so indebted: Hutter makes interpretive claims about figures from the Pre-Platonic philosophers through the Hellenistic schools, but gives the reader virtually no textual references with which to anchor his sometimes highly controversial readings. It may well be asking too much of a monograph-length study that it supply and defend readings of all the ancient texts upon which it wants to build a reading of a modern figure, but without some engagement of these texts, the analysis offered here can do no more than make vague reference to important figures in antiquity at the risk of doing them serious injustice by obscuring important differences among them--differences directly relevant to Hutter's analysis. According to Hutter, Nietzsche is in some respects an Epicurean (p. 27), in some respects his views are "Platonic-Aristotelian" (p. 84), elsewhere Hutter claims the influence of Socrates, Empedocles, Hippocrates, and Hesiod. But in none of these cases does he discuss or provide references to the ancient texts; rarely do we even see references to Nietzsche's remarks on these figures. At most, the author should claim resemblance to these Greek thinkers, and that only in qualified respects; there is insufficient textual support for some of the very ambitious interpretations of ancient figures offered by Hutter.

Many readers will feel that Hutter's analysis does particular violence to Plato, who plays a singularly important role in Shaping the Future, given Hutter's contention that Nietzsche is interested primarily in the legislation of values for the future and in the shaping not only of individual selves but also sustainable states. Hutter's Plato is a figure many Plato scholars will not recognize. On his view, there are many legitimate Platonisms, and Plato has no interest in defending just one: "Plato's writings seem like invitations to his readers to create for themselves 'invisible cities' in their souls, and there are potentially as many of these 'invisible cities' as there are serious readers of Plato" (p. 116). (There is a footnote to a secondary work on the Republic offered at this point, but not one reference to any Platonic text in support of this argument or the "openness" Hutter attributes to Plato.) Hutter pushes further, however, claiming that, "none of the many Platonisms constructed in the history of interpretations of Platonic dialogues, especially the 'definitive' and dogmatic ones, seem to me to be more than the result of creative misreading" (p. 126)! He admits that, "Such an opinion does not reflect full acquaintance with all existing interpretations of Plato," as is abundantly clear at this point, and not one such interpretation is discussed. This is far too sweeping a position to be advanced on the strength of such slender evidence.

Shaping the Future takes on a number of widely-discussed and important themes in Nietzsche's work: the paradox of free will and self-creation, the nature of the 'self' or 'soul' as Nietzsche understands it, his view of truth and knowledge, and his relationship to Greek thought. But in spite of this and despite its ambitious thesis, scholars interested in these issues will not find the book as useful as they might due to the lack of any engagement with the relevant contemporary literature on Nietzsche. For instance, the author ascribes to Nietzsche a view of truth familiar from earlier commentaries on his work, and one that sounds remarkably like the Falsification Thesis attributed to an immature Nietzsche in Maudemarie Clark's Nietzsche on Truth and Philosophy (Cambridge University Press, 1990):

For Nietzsche every definite concept, insofar as it is clear and unambiguous, … is ipso facto a falsification of the real. Merely because of their definiteness, such concepts would be untrue to the thoughts they attempt to encapsulate. They are also false in their lack of ambiguity, because phenomena are ambiguous and manifold. Things in the process of time and the flux of becoming could only be adequately grasped by multivariate concepts. (p. 138)

Clark's text appears in Hutter's final bibliography, but there is otherwise no trace of her careful handling of the issue, her persuasive argument that Nietzsche in his mature work repudiates this position, or any of the several responses, replies and developments of this position by other authors over the years. For the most part, it is as if the last fifteen-odd years of scholarship on Nietzsche had never happened. Those newer to reading Nietzsche may find that this book's freedom from scholarly apparatus makes it more readable, but they should be warned that Shaping the Future presents a highly contentious portrait of Nietzsche on the strength of too little conceptual clarity and argumentative support.