Shaping the Normative Landscape

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David Owens, Shaping the Normative Landscape, Oxford University Press, 2012, 260pp., $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780199691500.

Reviewed by Erin Taylor, Cornell University


Moral obligations arising from socially-structured transactions (like promising or consent) or involvements (like friendship) are notoriously difficult to theorize. Are such obligations explained by the goodness of the social practices that generate them? Or do they merely track the distinctive ways in which such social practices, once in place, make it possible to harm one another? On the one hand, social institutions like promising do seem desirable (and perhaps even morally necessary). The existence of that institution enables us to rely on others when we otherwise could not, and it thereby provides a foundation for social coordination. On the other hand, the wrong of breaking a promise is not primarily (if at all) a matter of undermining a useful social convention or free riding on the efforts of others who keep the institution alive. A broken promise wrongs the promisee in particular. Theories of the normativity of consent and associative obligations to kith and kin can be similarly divided. The intuitive appeal of both approaches has left many theorists at something of an impasse (or else just talking past each other). Shaping the Normative Landscape does two important things. First, it shows how these two general approaches can be reconciled. Second, it shows that some intractable difficulties across a wide range of normative phenomena have both an underlying unity and elegant solution. More importantly, the solution itself is intuitively appealing.

Owens postulates that, in addition to familiar non-normative interests (such as our interest in being able to coordinate with others, or our interest in not being physically harmed by others) we have what he calls normative interests. The postulation of normative interests in turn provides the grounding for a wide range of normative phenomena including promise, consent, forgiveness, and request. A normative interest is the interest that we have, not in what others actually do or feel, but in what it is appropriate or makes sense for people to do or feel. Thus, while we obviously have a non-normative interest in how others actually behave, we also have a normative interest in whether that behavior is obligatory, prohibited, or permissible. We have an interest not merely in whether others blame us, but also in whether or not their blame is appropriate or warranted.

Owens specifies four distinct normative interests. Taken together, they both predict and explain the details of an impressive range of normative phenomena not generally considered to be unified. We have deontic and permissive interests in controlling what kinds of things count as wrongs in the first place. Controlling what counts as a wrong specifically via declaration serves our permissive interest. Deontic interests, on the other hand, underwrite what Owens calls “obligations of involvement.” These characterize interpersonal relationships like friendship. What we want in friendship is at least partly “people who are bound to us and to whom we are bound in certain ways, as well as people with a special license for intimacy” (pp. 10-11). Such interpersonal involvements, including not only friendship but also acquaintanceship, neighbourliness, and relations of hospitality “thereby open up new possibilities of wronging and close down others” (p. 11). We have an authority interest in having the power to accept promises, which in turn oblige the promisor to do what she promised. Finally, we have a remissive interest in controlling when blame is warranted as a reaction to wrongings that occur. Our remissive interest explains forgiveness. While Owens does devote a significant portion of the first two chapters to a discussion of reactive attitudes, the bulk of the book focuses on the structure of obligation in general and the details of promissory obligation in particular.

The postulation of normative interests helps to explain some of the general characteristics of obligations, including: that what is obligatory is distinct from what is merely reasonable (given only non-normative interests); that obligations can be trivial and therefore decisively overridden; that obligations bind action rather than beliefs, desires, and other emotions; that obligations can conflict; and that failure to discharge an obligation can result in what Owens calls a bare wronging. I will focus on this last characteristic, as Owens claims that the explanation of bare wronging is a particular virtue of his account. A bare wronging is a wronging, but “not in virtue of its being an action against any human interest” (p. 8) (even on a capacious conception of human interests, including normative interests). The phenomenon of bare wronging occurs across a wide swath of ordinary morality, including not only promissory obligation but also property rights and political authority. The problem of bare wronging arises when, as Hume observed,

we have naturally no real or universal motive for observing the laws of equity, but the very equity and merit of that observance; and as no action can be equitable or meritorious where it cannot arise from some separate motive, there is here an evident sophistry and reasoning in a circle. (p. 124)

The existence of normative powers, which serve our authority and permissive interests, solves the puzzle. According to Owens, normative powers are machines for generating bare wrongings.

Owens’ ability to account for bare wronging in cases of promissory obligation, for example, separates his account from most “anti-conventionalists” such as Scanlon. According to Scanlon, the bindingness of a promise depends on the promisee expecting the promisor to do what he promised to do. This is why a promise-breaking wrongs the promisee in particular -- it is an action against one of the promisee’s interests. But where the expectation of fidelity never takes hold, then neither does the promissory obligation. This happens in cases like Scanlon’s “profligate pal,” who promises to repay a loan that the promisee never believes he will repay. If the promisee were also indifferent to repayment, or would be on balance better off for not being repaid, then it would be hard to see how the promisee’s interests could be served by keeping the promise. But we think that, when the promisor deliberates about whether or not to repay the loan, the fact of the promise would make sense of deciding to repay. It might even be the only thing that would make repayment intelligible. This indicates that the profligate pal’s promise binds and that breaking the promise constitutes a bare wronging.

Owens’ account of promising is different from both anti-conventionalists like Scanlon and “practice theorists” like Hume and Rawls. According to Owens, a promise is made when a promisor communicates an intention to undertake an obligation. A promissory obligation is therefore created by declaration. It is not created as a result of the injuries possibly sustained, by either the promisee or society as a whole, should the promise be broken. It is crucial that the authority interest served by promissory obligation is not an interest in the promise being kept. It is rather an interest in the promise-breaking counting as a wrong. This is what makes it a normative interest and also why the generation of bare wrongings lies at the heart of promissory obligation. This normative interest is not harmed provided that breaking the promise is a wronging if the promisee says so, and its being a wronging does not usually depend on whether the promisor performs (p. 148). The fact that the normative interest in question is the promisee’s interest in gaining authority over the promisor explains why a promise-breaking wrongs the promisee in particular rather than society as a whole. The postulation of the normative interest served by promissory obligation seems capable of explaining many other practice-invariant features as well: that a promise binds whether or not the promisor intends to perform or even communicates the intention to perform; that a promise will not be valid unless it is accepted by the promisee; that promisees must have the power to release the promisor; that promises are invalid if procured through duress or deception; and that the impermissibility of making or keeping a promise is insufficient to invalidate it.

While the postulation of normative interests does seem to explain and unify the details of our practices of consent and promise, normative interests may not be the only thing capable of explaining the general structural features of obligation. Owens claims that what the practice theorists got right was a recognition that the power to make a promise must be socially recognized in order to be real. Our normative interests “are satisfied only given the existence of . . . customs and practices, and once they do exist, they create obligations that apply to all members of the relevant social group” (p. 116). Owens includes a serious treatment of the role that social customs and practices play in serving our normative interests, but may not give enough weight to the role that they play in explaining many of the very same features normative interests are postulated to explain. Recall some of the structural features of obligations: that they are overridable, that they can conflict, that they bind performance rather than beliefs or emotions, and that failure to comply can generate a bare wronging. These structural features of obligations may be explained by the role that social practices play in their generation.

The kinds of social practices that Owens is concerned with are ones that people follow at least partly because other people do. That is, the fact that others follow a practice plays an important role in making sense of following the practice oneself. In order for that to be the case, participants in the practice have to be able to know whether others are in fact following the practice, as opposed to failing to follow or only appearing to follow. That is, participants’ conformance to the practice must be accessible to others. Accessibility ensures that obligations mediated by social practice cannot bind belief or emotion. They can only bind the simulations of those mental states as borne out in action. Furthermore, in order to count as a social practice, a level of general conformity with the practice must meet a certain threshold. That is, social practices are constituted by social behavior that is sufficiently regular. Absent a code stipulated in advance (as in legislation), this regularity is part of the way that participants know what obligations they have according to the social practice. But features of participants’ situations that are sufficiently unusual have not been encountered often enough to enable a regular response. This means that the obligations mediated by social practices cannot be too fine-grained, or tailored to the unique circumstances of individual participants.

Accessibility and regularity together explain why obligations mediated by social practice will be merely pro tanto, provided that what one ought to do all-things-considered may depend on inaccessible or unusual features of one’s situation. If such obligations are merely pro tanto, then they are also overridable and capable of conflicting. And finally, given that the obligations mediated by social practice must be coarse-grained, there may be unusual situations in which conformance to the practice serves no one’s interests. This can be the case even when the practice generally serves vital human interests and serves them as efficiently as possible. One of Owens’ own examples illustrates this well. Consider the father who

fails to keep in touch with his adult children; he liked the children when they are [sic] young but has since lost interest in them. Here the father . . . probably is failing in the duties of parenthood as generally understood. Wouldn’t our dad be better off without this ongoing obligation? Nevertheless, it surely applies to him . . . and does so regardless of his own inclinations. (p. 116)

We may add that his adult children would be indifferent to whether or not he keeps in touch, and nobody else really cares either. Still, as with Scanlon’s profligate pal we can make moral sense of the father’s decision to keep in touch by adverting to his practice-mediated obligations of fatherhood. Thus, if social practices are capable of mediating moral obligations at all, then given the coarse-grained nature of those obligations bare wrongings will be possible. This happens with or without the postulation of normative interests.

Ultimately, the theoretical advantages gained by postulating normative interests may be slightly narrower than Owens suggests. Nevertheless, Shaping the Normative Landscape delivers on the promise to “establish the existence and content of our normative interests by describing how they hang together with other elements of a theory that has a certain overall explanatory power” (p. 7).