Shared Agency: A Planning Theory of Acting Together

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Michael E. Bratman, Shared Agency: A Planning Theory of Acting Together, Oxford University Press, 2014, 219pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780199339990.

Reviewed by Raimo Tuomela, University of Helsinki/University of Munich


In this book Michael Bratman presents a unified and systematic theory, termed "planning theory", of shared agency. It is concisely written and presents the fullest version of his planning theory to date. This book is a welcome contribution to the literature on philosophical action theory and on collective intentionality phenomena by one of the leading theorists in the field.

The chapters bear the following titles: 1. Sociality and Planning Agency, 2. Building Blocks, Part 1, 3. Building Blocks, Part 2, 4. A Construction of Modest Sociality, 5. Modest Sociality and Mutual Obligation, 6. Group Agents Without Group Subjects, 7. Shared Deliberation, Common Ground, Conclusion: Interconnected Planning Agents.

In the first chapter Bratman goes through some of the main elements of the planning theory -- such as social rationality norms for intentions and policies. He also introduces the central underlying thesis, the continuity thesis (see below). In chapter 2 he discusses and clarifies intentions, including the intention that we do something together and interlocking and meshing intentions. In chapter 3 he considers such conditions for intentions as the own-action and settle conditions, as well as the kinds of interdependence between intentions.[1]

Given the basic conceptual machinery that his theory needs, Bratman proceeds to the analytical and systematic development of his intention-based account of "modest sociality" in the rest of the book. Chapter 4 is the most central one, although in the rest of the chapters he also adds to the basic theory and applies the theory to some related discussed philosophical topics. Bratman starts this chapter with an account of the basic features of shared intentions (see pp. 85-86 and below). (Some authors might speak of joint intentions or of intending together in this context.)

What is modest sociality? Bratman mentions "friendship and love, singing duets, dancing together, and the joys of conversation" as basic forms of sociality that he intends to study (p. 3): what concepts are needed for an understanding of them and what do these forms of sociality involve? how does normativity come into the picture?

I take it that the aforementioned "basic forms" of sociality represent "modest" sociality. Yet it seems to me that the theory developed in the book may not suffice for giving a satisfactory "conceptual, metaphysical, and normative account" (p. 151) at least of all the mentioned kinds of sociality. E.g., love would clearly seem to require bringing emotions into play, but that does not happen in Bratman's individualistic theory.[2] It seems plausible on the other hand that the theory will suffice for giving an account of at least some basic forms of sociality for which shared intentions and intentional shared action are central (think of two persons sharing the intention to go for lunch together). Yet there is social interaction (e.g., reciprocity interaction) that is not based on shared intentionality and that thus cannot qualify as modest sociality.

Bratman adopts the following conjecture called the continuity thesis: "the conceptual, metaphysical, and normative structures central to such modest sociality are . . . continuous with structures of individual planning agency" (p. 8). His theory at hand does not cover, e.g., corporations, and institutions, as they are not forms of modest sociality. Accordingly, regarding the scope of his theory, Bratman says: "The limitation is that my focus will be primarily on the shared intentional activities of small, adult groups in the absence of asymmetric authority relations within those groups, and in which the individuals who are participants remain constant over time" (p. 7).

To give the reader of this review a better feel of what Bratman's planning theory contains I will here -- in view of the limited space available and without proper motivating discussion -- present Bratman's concise summary of his basic thesis (presented on pp. 85-86). This summary he calls the "compressed basic thesis" (p. 103):

A.   Intention condition: We each have intentions that we J; and we each intend that we J by way of each of our intentions that we J (so there is interlocking and reflexivity) and by way of relevant mutual responsiveness in sub-plan and action, and so by way of sub-plans that mesh.
B.    Belief condition: We each believe that if the intentions of each in favor of our J-ing persist, we will J by way of those intentions and relevant mutual responsiveness in sub-plan and action; and we each believe that there is interdependence in persistence of those intentions of each in favor of our J-ing.

C.    Interdependence condition: There is interdependence in persistence of the intentions of each in favor of our J-ing.

D.   Common knowledge condition: It is common knowledge that A-D.

E.    Mutual responsiveness condition: our shared intention to J leads to our J-ing by way of public mutual responsiveness in sub-intention and action that tracks the end intended by each of the joint activity by way of the intentions of each in favor of that joint activity.

Bratman claims that conditions A-E provide sufficient conditions for shared intention and modest sociality. Of these conditions A is crucial: shared intentionality and sociality based on it are the most central concern of the book. As Bratman does not give necessary conditions for modest sociality it remains somewhat unclear what the scope of this notion is.[3] Another lacuna in the account is that Bratman does not specify in detail, e.g., in terms of the participants' reasoning patterns, how the shared intention guides the participants to act toward the satisfaction of the shared intention that they J. Some other accounts do try to answer this problem. Thus team reasoning (see, e.g., Bacharach, 1999) and the somewhat different group-based "we-mode" reasoning that I have advocated (e.g., in Tuomela, 2013) are such accounts based on the idea of identification with the group.[4] These accounts are able to show, for instance, that in the well-known coordination game Hi-Lo the alternative Hi will be chosen and Lo be excluded although both the joint outcomes HiHi and LoLo are equilibria.

More generally, the we-mode approach and its employment of group reasoning (joint member reasoning from the group's point of view) seems to do some things (e.g., coordination of member action) better than individualistic theories. Here I will mention an interesting game-theoretical result hinted at above that speaks for the we-mode account (that I myself have advocated in my recent books) and for the serious employment of group notions when accounting for and explaining individual action as well as joint action in group contexts. One of game-theoretician Michael Bacharach's (1999) results can be and has been applied to show that an individualistic approach based on I-thinking and I-reasoning, where the participants nevertheless aim to benefit the group, and the we-mode account do not entail the same equilibrium behaviors in the case of common interest games.[5] In the we-mode case the participants will end up in the HiHi equilibrium, which maximizes the group's expected utility (and satisfies the members' common interest) in contrast to LoLo. For instance, the kind of individualistic account referred to above, which is based on "private" reasoning by the participants, allows for action-equilibria that are not best for the group or for the participants jointly (e.g., LoLo in a two-person Hi-Lo situation is a point at stake). In the we-mode case HiHi is an equilibrium that also maximizes the group's expected utility (and satisfies the members' common interest) in contrast to LoLo.[6] Bratman does not discuss this or other coordination games, but they might have been a good test case for this account; and the same goes for collective action dilemmas such as the Prisoner's Dilemma.

The mentioned result about the differences in equilibria between the we-mode approach and the I-mode approach applies primarily to (individualistically viewed) common interest game situations with strong interdependence -- when re-conceptualized from the group's point of view, making joint outcomes the objects of choice of the group. Such game situations have room for cooperation, so to speak. This result's game-theoretic conditions and conclusion seem to have applications also to real life situations.[7]

Chapter 5 concerns the relationship between joint commitments and mutual obligations. In contrast to Margaret Gilbert's view, Bratman's basic view has been and is that no mutual obligations are per see involved in joint commitments. I will not discuss this problem area here.

As to chapter 6, Bratman discusses the need for group agents and in a sense admits that they can exist. His individualistic theory does not accept the group as a primitive notion (pp. 123-4). Yet, if group agents (groups that can act as groups) are viewed in terms of "the relevant underlying structure of interrelated individuals" (p. 123), Bratman's account in those cases (where the individuals do act for their group and not fully selfishly) amounts to a kind of group. According to Gilbert, for example, group agents are "plural subjects" to which a mind and mental states (including phenomenal ones) can be attributed. However, Bratman's account claims that group agents are not subjects. (My account in my 2013 book agrees with this latter claim and argues that groups basically are not intrinsically but, at best, extrinsically intentional agents.)

In chapter 7 Bratman discusses shared deliberation on the basis of a common ground of views and evaluations. Shared deliberation is shared intentional activity embedded in a group's intentional activity. In shared deliberation the participants reason together, which involves a common ground of shared commitments to treating certain considerations (e.g., norms and values) as mattering (possibly with differing weights) to their shared deliberation. Deliberation qua shared intentional activity is guided by shared intention. However, there is no account of how the shared commitments or intentions come about or how they lead to concrete action intentions in the case of individuals. In the case of Bratmanian shared intentional activity the participants' reasons may be different from each other, in contrast to group-based accounts (e.g., the we-mode account), where the group gives at least one central reason for action to add to purely individual reasons.

The matters dealt with in chapter 7 have been treated by other authors under different terms (e.g., group or team reasoning, collective acceptance, group discussion, collective commitment, collective goals and preferences, group beliefs, etc.).

As a final point, I wish to emphasize that the continuity thesis possibly fails in the case of groups and group properties and in other cases with "interaction effects" due to individual interaction (e.g., as involved in the central mutual responsiveness requirement). My critical point is the obvious one that there seem to be irreducible and emergent social notions -- in contrast to the continuity thesis. E.g., the homogeneity of a social group, social position (e.g., professor), group, institution, government, money, marriage, etc. are notions that seem not to be reducible to an individualistic basis.

Bratman's theory is well put together from some rather simple elements and is written in good style. His book is essential reading for researchers and students in the philosophy of action, especially those interested in an individualistic account that is written clearly in plain English.


Bacharach, M. 1999. Interactive Team Reasoning: A Contribution to the Theory of Cooperation. Research in Economics 53 (2): 117-147.

Hakli, Raul, K. Miller, and R. Tuomela. 2010. Two Kinds of We-Reasoning. Economics and Philosophy 26 (03): 291-320.

Tuomela, R. 2007. The Philosophy of Sociality: The Shared Point of View, New York: Oxford University Press.

Tuomela, R. 2013. Social Ontology: Collective Intentionality and Group Agents, New York: Oxford University Press.

[1] For comparison consider now my way (in chapter 3 of my Social Ontology) of accounting for shared intentions and we-intentions. My account does not use Bratman's "intentions that . . . ", which do not satisfy the own action condition. This condition says that the subject of an intention is also the agent of the intended action.

When we jointly intend to perform action X jointly the following two claims are regarded as central and true in my account:

(i)             We jointly intend to perform action X jointly.

(ii)           I we-intend to perform my share (or part) of our performing X jointly.

Both (i) and (ii) clearly satisfy the own action condition.

[2] An individualistic theory is, roughly, a theory that in principle makes use only of notions concerning individuals, their properties and the relations between them, but does not assume group notions as primitive ones.

[3] In my own theorizing, most recently in Tuomela (2013), I have discussed most of the above conditions within my I-mode/we-mode approach to sociality (below I will speak of the we-mode approach).

[4] I wish to thank Raul Hakli for the suggestion to discuss the present matter and for his comments.

[5] See Tuomela, 2013, chapter 7; also cf. Hakli, Miller, and Tuomela, 2010.

[6] We-mode actions and attitudes (involved, e.g., in we-mode group or "team" reasoning) are based on the members' identification with a group and as a consequence of this will be taken to satisfy the three criteria of the presence of a central group-based reason for a member's performance of her part of the group's action: first, collective commitment to the item, or topic under discussion; second, involvement of each group member's participation in the collective commitment (Bratman's notion of meshing intentions bears some similarity to this idea); third, the so-called collectivity condition indicating that the participants are "in the same boat" (see Tuomela, 2007 and 2013). These features form an important part of the glue that makes people stick together, e.g., in social dilemma situations. The we-mode approach gives group-based reasoning a central place, e.g., in deriving action recommendations for the members. In general the assumption is made that social situations are to be viewed from the group's point of view in the first place and from the individual's point of view only in so far as he acts as a group member. Roughly, group reasoning leads to action satisfying the group members' shared intention, maximizes expected group utility and leads to the satisfaction of common interest.

[7] See Tuomela, 2013, chapter 7; also cf. Hakli, Miller, and Tuomela, 2010.