Shifting Ground: Knowledge and Reality, Transgression and Trustworthiness

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Naomi Scheman, Shifting Ground: Knowledge and Reality, Transgression and Trustworthiness, Oxford University Press, 2011, 251pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780195395105.

Reviewed by Pieranna Garavaso, University of Minnesota Morris




The eleven essays of this volume -- all published between 1995 and 2008 - are grouped around three main subjects: four essays are devoted to Knowledge; three to Reality; and the last four to Transgression and Trustworthiness. The theoretical areas covered in the essays are unrelated, "possibly hostile to one another," (4) for each essay was written in response to a specific request and is directed to a specific audience. Short and interesting introductions to the different sections provide the history of individual essays and connect them with essays in other sections. These writings display a feature shared by much feminist philosophy and distinctive of Naomi Scheman's work: core philosophical issues such as objectivity, personal identity, and the nature of the ultimate reality are examined from marginalized perspectives or in connection with topics not commonly discussed within analytic philosophy, such as the identity of transsexuals and Jews, community based research, or teaching for social justice. Scheman's writing style is intriguing and never dull; there is much cleverness and insight in this body of work; some passages and one or two essays are denser than the others and may be better appreciated after slower or repeated reading. The footnotes provide a glimpse of the broad scholarship that nourishes Scheman's work and contain excellent suggestions for further reading.

Epistemology is at the center of Scheman's thinking as it dominates all sections, even the one devoted to ontology. She defends a form of practical, i.e., politically engaged, standpoint naturalized epistemology (10-11). This epistemology concerns the epistemic problems of real people; it recognizes the impossibility of giving abstract and absolute notions of objectivity and truth. Throughout the articles one can see the influence of Wittgenstein's thought as Scheman gives special attention to language in practice and to forms of life. Moreover, Scheman seems to share Wittgenstein's critical approach to mainstream philosophy, whether on the apprehension of language or on the existence of mind-independent meanings. She approaches philosophical questions from marginalized standpoints and repeatedly calls into question attempts to generalize any specific point of view. The question "Who do we mean by 'we'?" is often explicitly raised and at other times tacitly implied. Unlike Wittgenstein, though, Scheman stresses the political dimensions of any philosophical theorizing: "We have entered post-modernity characterized by a politics of difference" (6); this new phase arises from the demise of the ideals of modernity and liberalism. The main aim of the collection is to articulate "a 'postmodern' epistemology, which puts diversity and a politics of social justice in place of the universalistic abstract individualism that have [sic] framed the epistemology and politics of modernity" (12). Accordingly, in several articles Scheman attempts to give "robust, usable articulations" of the notion of objectivity. We will come back later to the question whether or not this interesting move is fully successful.

The section on Knowledge contains two essays focused on theoretical issues and two essays focused on identity as an epistemic stance. "Non-Negotiable Demands: Metaphysics, Politics, and the Discourse of Needs" centers on the demands at the origin of philosophical theories and argues that such demands cannot be met; furthermore, if these demands were met, they would not satisfy the needs from which they arise. Three traditional philosophical problems are discussed: realism versus idealism; universal moral standards; and privileged access. Here, we see Scheman performing a move which is repeated with regard to different issues in other parts of the volume, i.e., transposing century old and prima facie thoroughly abstract problems under the new guises of hotly political contemporary concerns, e.g., the reenactment of the debate between those who assert and those who deny the existence of a mind-independent reality as the question of which type of realism can best capture "the real needs of the marginalized or subordinated" (25), or which realism can be as rigorous about the knowing subjects as it is about the objects of knowledge.

The second chapter, "Feminist Epistemology," was presented during a 1994 APA panel exchange with Louise Antony. Antony's commentary and Scheman's reply to it, which are not reprinted here, appeared in print in Metaphilosophy the following year. Two main aims of the article are to argue that there should be a field called feminist epistemology and to give an idea of the work done in this area. The second part focuses on the development of a non-individualistic notion of the epistemic subject, on the epistemic relevance of uneven social and political power, and on the critique of objectivity as the goal of knowledge and of the reigning normative epistemic standards.

"On Waking Up One Morning and Discovering We Are Them" is the first of two autobiographical essays. It focuses on how to be a radical academic while teaching undergraduate and graduate students. Unlike many women philosophers who experienced discrimination and sexual harassment -- see for example the narratives collected by Linda Martín Alcoff in Singing in the Fire (2003) -- Scheman, by her own admission, represents a lucky exception (53). This thoughtful narrative refutes the stereotypes that appear in attacks to radical feminist academics such as those contained in some of Christina Hoff Sommers' articles.

The second autobiographical essay focuses on Jewish identity. A terminal moraine is the residue of rock fragments left by a receding glacier; in the essay that takes its title from it, the terminal moraine is a metaphor for the Jewish location: "To grow up on terminal moraine is to grow up on the unnarratable fragments of other people's stories… . The experience for which I am evoking the image of terminal moraine is that of having the ground under one's feet be that of other people's stories." (67-68)

The reality discussed in the essays in Part II is not so much the focus of traditional ontology, but rather a reality inspired by Wittgenstein's metaphor of the 'rough ground,' i.e., our practices and forms of life. In "Against Physicalism," Scheman rejects physicalism, defined as the view that explanations of human behaviors and mental life based on beliefs, intentions, emotions, desires, and attitudes refer to events, states, and processes identical to, or dependent on or determined by, events, states, or processes in the body of the person to whom the behavior or mental life are ascribed (84). Instead she claims that

beliefs, desires, emotions, and other phenomena of our mental lives are the particulars that they are because they are socially meaningful, and when they figure as those particulars in causal accounts, neither those accounts nor the phenomena that figure in them survive abstraction from social context (83-84).

At the beginning of this essay, Scheman characterizes "most" contemporary analytic philosophy as naturalized, i.e., as claiming that "the physical sciences are the lodestone both for epistemology and for ontology." (81) As much as I wish it were true, this seems to me inaccurate and refuted by the still ongoing debates about the normative but not descriptive role of philosophy (just as a recent example of non-naturalized analytic philosophy, see Christian Barth's Objectivity and the language-dependence of thought : a transcendental defence of universal lingualism (2011).

"Feeling Our Way toward Moral Objectivity" is an essay on the borderline between ethics and cognitive science. Scheman argues for two main theses. The first is the denial that emotions are states of individuals; their identity as complex entities is based on explanatory schemes that gain a meaning only after being interpreted within social contexts (98). The second thesis argues that, contrary to common opinion, emotions are not obstacles to, but instead facilitators for, the achievement of objectivity in moral judgments (104). Very much in agreement with Helen Longino's conception of scientific objectivity, Scheman regards objective moral judgments as those that have "come out and been subjected to the critical workings of a sufficiently democratic community" (107).

The starting point of "Queering the Center by Centering the Queer: Reflections on Transsexuals and Secular Jews" is the conflict between two goals for the marginalized: either to integrate with the privileged as much as possible or to disrupt the norm. In arguing for a better way out of this dichotomy, Scheman defends the role of relational notions of memory and narrativity in the creation of a self: "Narrativity per se may be humanly important, but we have no access to narrativity per se: What we have are culturally specific narratives, which facilitate the smooth telling of some lives and straitjacket, distort, or fracture others." (113) A comparison and contrast between Jewish identity and the identity of transsexuals leads to the finding of a certain unavoidable level of ambiguity in the identities of those who are marginalized: "the experiences of variously marginalized people provide alternative models of subjectivity, less seamless and transparent, less coherent and solid, than those of privilege" (144).

The focus of the third and last part of the collection is the future and how we may want to start the work of transformation of philosophy, which the previous sections have shown to be necessary, if we want to pay attention to the 'real needs' of those who discuss philosophical problems. "Forms of Life: Mapping the Rough Ground" starts from the problem of finding a viable notion of objectivity without any commitment to the view that Wittgenstein rejected throughout his whole life, i.e., the idea that there is a mind-independent reality and that only some correspondence with such a reality can make a thesis true and objective or a practice objectively correct. Scheman points out, "where one can stand to obtain a perspective on a set of practices that is simultaneously informed and critical is a deep and central question for political theory," especially with regard to "multiculturalism" (150). Here is another example of Scheman's ability to connect philosophical perspectives not at the center of mainstream or analytical debate to core problems such as the opposition between objectivity and relativism.

The next two articles are markedly different from the others in this collection and their difference is a powerful testament to the seriousness with which Scheman takes the commitment of philosophers and epistemologists to produce engaged and practical knowledge. "The Trustworthiness of Research: The Paradigm of Community-Based Research" is coauthored with Catherine Jordan, a pediatric neuropsychologist, and Susan Gust, a community organizer. The authors argue for "a fundamental shift in the academic research culture, a shift that takes the ethos of community-based participatory research (CBPR) as the preferred approach to instilling trust in the research enterprise" (170). One interesting contrast is between the exclusive mutual trust shared by the scientists engaged in research governed by the Standard Norms of customary laboratory science and the trust between scientists and community arising from CBPR. After outlining and defending the main features of CBPR, this article provides a report on the results of an actual example of CBPR, i.e., a study to address the concerns regarding lead poisoning in the Phillips Community in Minneapolis and on the initiatives originating from this study. "Narrative, Complexity, and Context: Autonomy as an Epistemic Value" has also a connection with a real life example of CBPR, namely the usefulness of narratives in the acknowledgment and protection of the autonomy of patients in relationships with doctors and nurses. This paper discusses the epistemology of naturalized and narrative bioethics, i.e., bioethics grounded in the specificities of practice and in the stories told by the different participants in those practices. Scientists can do their work best, especially from an epistemic point of view, "only insofar as they think of themselves and the knowledge they create as framed by, and responsible to, the relationships in which, whether they recognize it or not, they are enmeshed." (206).

The last article, "Epistemology Resuscitated: Objectivity as Trustworthiness," provides a fit ending for the collection as it is characterized by both the epistemological focus dear to the author and by a tight link between Scheman's theoretical and political commitments. The paper was motivated by the "science wars" of the 1990s and was meant as a defense of that part of feminist epistemology and philosophy of science that is most friendly to the notion of objectivity against the critics who claimed that the feminist criticisms of traditional science methods together with the criticisms coming from postmodern cultural theorists destroy all notions of objectivity. Scheman strives to save objectivity and interprets the work of feminist philosophy of science as

developing accounts of objectivity that take seriously our need for it: If objectivity is an instrumental good, then it has actually to function so as to produce the good it promises: what we label 'objective' has actually to be worthy of our trust and the trust of a diverse range of others. (210)

Scheman proposes a type of objectivity that arises from a community of research when community members are included in the process and work on the project alongside scientists, when trust ensues between community and scientists.

This volume rewards its readers with the breadth of its topics and a writing style that captivates the readers' attention. From this body of work emerges a position that is as intriguing as it is problematic, for it strives to weave together two approaches to philosophy that seem prima facie antithetical. Scheman's epistemology is naturalized and yet she wants to incorporate also a Wittgensteinian appeal to practices and forms of life. However, Wittgenstein explicitly and repeatedly rejected a naturalistic approach to philosophical inquiry and many of his contemporary interpreters appeal to him exactly to bolster a non-naturalized philosophy, e.g., Avrum Stroll and Danièle Moyal-Sharrock. I am not raising the question whether Scheman is reading Wittgenstein correctly as she is clearly not interested in exegesis, but rather in letting Wittgenstein's insights guide her thinking. My question is rather how two perspectives, i.e., naturalism on one side and a Wittgensteinian appeal to the normativity of practices and forms of life on the other, can ever be successfully weaved together. Scheman seems to acknowledge at least one version of this conflict when she states, "Those who hold on to internalist conceptions of scientific objectivity do so in part because they believe that a naturalized account of science as a social practice is a wholly different endeavor from a normative account of it as truth producing" (231). The only regret I am left with after reading this book is that I wish I had found in it a more explicit discussion of how to accomplish this synthesis.