Shooting to Kill: The Ethics of Police and Military Use of Lethal Force

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Seumas Miller, Shooting to Kill: The Ethics of Police and Military Use of Lethal Force, Oxford University Press, 2016, 294 pp., $39.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780190626143.

Reviewed by David Killoren, Australian Catholic University


Seumas Miller is one of the rare philosophers who are able to give serious attention to real-world problems while also doing the kind of theoretical work that is necessary in order to shed distinctively philosophical light on these problems. In his new book on the ethics of police and military killing, Miller moves easily and gracefully from abstract theoretical arguments to real-world cases and back again. In my view, Miller's work demonstrates the potential of philosophy to matter for the real world without sacrificing analytic rigor. For that reason, I hope that this book will be read by many people, including many moral philosophers, and not just those who work specifically on issues in military or police ethics.

The book draws from a lot of material that Miller has published elsewhere, but is not merely a scattershot collection of papers on a theme. The book forms a coherent and tightly argued whole and represents a valuable contribution to scholarship over and above Miller's copious previous output.

Early on (Chapter 2), Miller provides an account of justifiable killing in self-defense, which he calls the fault-based internalist suspendable-rights theory (FIST). Miller has defended this view elsewhere and provides a careful defense of it here as well. According to this view,

You have a right not to be killed by me, and I have a concomitant obligation not to kill you. However you suspend your own right not to be killed by me if you come to have all the following properties:

1. You are a deadly threat to me.

2. You intend to kill me and are responsible for having this intention to kill me.

3. You do not have a good and decisive moral justification for killing me, and you do not reasonably believe that you have a good and decisive moral justification for killing me. (p. 71)

Building on this, Miller provides a theoretical account of institutional actors -- police and military -- and defends a range of views about how their rights and obligations differ from those of ordinary agents (Chapters 3 and 4). Then Miller applies his account in a wide range of different areas: suicide bombers (Chapter 5), the military use of lethal force (Chapter 6), the issue of civilian immunity from attack (Chapter 7), humanitarian armed interventions (Chapter 8), targeted killing (Chapter 9), and autonomous weapons (Chapter 10).

Miller is throughout the book concerned with the distinction between institutional and noninstitutional cases. The former cases are ones in which police officers or military combatants -- i.e., so-called institutional actors -- use lethal force against, e.g., an attacker. The latter cases are ones in which noninstitutional actors, e.g., individuals in the state of nature, use lethal force. Miller argues that the rights and obligations of institutional actors can differ from those of noninstitutional actors. For example, he argues (Chapter 4) that a police officer may be morally entitled or even obligated to kill a suspect of serious crimes who is attempting to avoid arrest, provided the suspect needs to be killed in order to prevent the suspect from escaping, even if the suspect only uses the threat of deadly force to avoid arrest and will not otherwise harm anyone.

Miller is keenly attentive to the complex relations that obtain between individual agents and collectives. Miller rejects supraindividualism, the idea that "when a plurality of individual agents perform a joint action, the agents necessarily have the relevant propositional attitudes (beliefs, intentions, etc.) in an irreducible 'we-form' which is sui generis, and as such not analyzable in terms of individual or I-attitudes" (p. 29). But Miller also does not deny that something new can arise when agents function together. Here (and in other work) he defends a view he calls "collective end theory," according to which individuals can engage in joint actions aimed at a collective end. This theory is employed repeatedly in arguments throughout the book.

The book contains far more valuable and interesting material than I have space to discuss here. But I would like to take this opportunity to examine one crucial component of Miller's theory, namely FIST, which as I mentioned above is defended in Chapter 2, and is important for arguments in subsequent chapters as well.

Consider a case where you are attacking me with your bare fists. You're a scrawny professional philosopher, and I'm a seasoned professional boxer. You can kill me if I do nothing to defend myself -- so you are, strictly speaking, a deadly threat to me -- but I can easily prevent you from harming me by dodging your punches or by simply walking away from you. You intend to kill me and are responsible for that intention. You do not have any moral justification for killing me -- you only want to kill me because, say, you're angry about having lost some money by placing a foolish bet on my last boxing match. On Miller's view, if I kill you in this case I don't violate your right to life. For you satisfy all of FIST's conditions and therefore have suspended your right to life.

Now, this does not mean that on Miller's view it would be morally right for me to kill you. Miller thinks that I would typically have a moral obligation not to kill you in this type of case even though killing you would not violate your right to life. There may be an obligation not to destroy what has moral value and the life of the attacker may have moral value; there may be an obligation to be merciful to those who have wronged you; there may be obligations arising from consequences for the attacker's family if the attacker is killed (pp. 73-4). And there may be an obligation arising from the fact that if defenders are generally allowed to kill their attackers, this would have dire consequences for the members of their community, and would "almost certainly lead to interpersonal and communal violence spiraling out of control" (p. 77). So, on Miller's view, I may well have an obligation not to kill you even though killing you wouldn't violate your right to life.

Some may quibble over Miller's claims about consequences; for there may be some communities in the past or even today where defenders are generally allowed to kill attackers yet violence doesn't spiral out of control. But even if we grant Miller's claims about consequences, as well as his further claims about additional relevant moral considerations (e.g., the moral value of any given attacker's life), I don't think that Miller's view of this type of case is fully adequate. In general, it seems to me that A wrongs B when A kills B unnecessarily. And killing you in this case is -- as Miller recognizes -- unnecessary, given that I can neutralize the threat that you pose to me without harming you. So, intuitively, if I were to kill you in the boxer-vs.-philosopher case, then I would wrong you. Yet Miller's account has difficulty capturing that intuition, insofar as we would need to posit a non-suspended right to life in order to explain why killing you would not merely be wrong but would also wrong you.

There is also a deeper worry about Miller's position. To see this, let us first consider a modification of the case. Suppose again that you intend to kill me. And suppose as before that you have no justification for killing me. But in this second case, you are using a method that cannot be effective: you are trying to cast a magical spell. You think the spell will kill me, but it won't work because magic isn't real. In this case it is intuitively very plausible that I would violate your right to life if I were to kill you. If Miller denies this judgment, he pays a serious intuitive cost. So I think Miller should accept the judgment that in the second case your right to life is not suspended. And Miller can accept this judgment. After all, FIST is consistent with this judgment (given that you are not in this case a deadly threat to me). So far, so good.

There is a natural way to explain why your right to life is preserved in this second case. Although you intend to kill me and you have no justification for this intention, I do not need to kill you in order to preserve my life; killing you is, in a word, unnecessary. But of course Miller cannot offer this natural explanation, because this would commit him to the view that your right to life remains unsuspended in the previous case as well.

Instead, if Miller wants to agree that your right to life in the second case isn't suspended, he has to say it is preserved just because you do not pose a threat to me -- whereas, in the first case (the philosopher-vs.-boxer case), you do pose a threat (albeit an easily neutralized one) and thus your right to life is suspended. In that case Miller needs to claim that there is a very important moral distinction between posing no threat at all, on the one hand, and posing an easily neutralized threat, on the other hand. In particular he needs to claim that if you unjustifiably intend to kill someone, you can keep your right to life as long as you pose no threat at all, but you lose that right when you pose an easily neutralized threat (assuming that the relevant intention to kill is present in both cases).

But the idea that this distinction is morally important is problematic. For one thing, it is not even clear to me how to draw that distinction. For example, the United States can easily repel any attack by Liechtenstein, but Liechtenstein could conquer the United States if the United States were to do nothing whatsoever to defend itself in the event of a Liechtensteinian attack. Given these facts, some may readily agree that Liechtenstein poses no threat at all to the United States, but it seems equally natural to say that Liechtenstein (supposing counterfactually it goes to war) poses an easily neutralized threat. I do not know which of those claims would be correct.

So, what exactly does it take to pose a (perhaps easily neutralized) deadly threat? Perhaps:

Threats Require Action: You pose a deadly threat to me iff there is something I must do in order to avoid being killed by you.

But that doesn't seem right. If you intentionally leave a deadly trap for me on a path that I usually walk to work, you thereby pose a deadly threat to me. But in this case, in order to avoid being killed by you, there is nothing that I must do; rather, I must refrain from doing something (in particular, I must refrain from walking my usual path). So, Threats Require Action is too restrictive.


Threats Require Either Action or Inaction: You pose a deadly threat to me iff there is either something I must do, or something I must refrain from doing, in order to avoid being killed by you.

But then you would pose a deadly threat to me as long as there is something, anything, that I could do to cause you to kill me. For example, as long as you would kill me in self-defense were I to attack you, then according to this principle you presently pose a deadly threat to me, even if I have no intention of ever attacking you and even if there is no other circumstance in which you'd kill me. That doesn't seem right. So, Threats Require Either Action or Inaction is too broad.

In any case, however we end up drawing the distinction, it is hard for me to see how this distinction will turn out to be morally important in the way that I think Miller requires. That is, it is hard to see why an ill-intentioned individual's right to life should remain in full force as long as that individual poses no threat, but should vanish into the ether as soon as that individual comes to pose an extremely easily neutralized threat -- if in either case killing the individual is unnecessary. For these reasons, I am skeptical of FIST. But this, I hasten to add, doesn't detract from the value of Miller's discussion of FIST -- especially given that FIST's main alternatives are, as Miller explains, also problematic.

As I've emphasized, this book contains a wealth of insightful discussions that map difficult theoretical terrain while also exploring a wide range of cases that are of great practical significance. Anyone with interests in theoretical or practical ethics will find value in this book. Additionally, those who are responsible for making life-and-death decisions, or who are responsible for crafting rules and policies to guide others making such decisions, will not struggle to see how Miller's work may be relevant to their own work.