Sidgwick’s The Methods of Ethics: A Guide

Sidgwick S The Methods Of Ethics

David Phillips, Sidgwick’s The Methods of Ethics: A Guide, Oxford University Press, 2022, 254pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780197539613.

Reviewed by Anthony Skelton, University of Western Ontario


David Phillips’s book is a beautifully written and expertly curated aid to studying Henry Sidgwick’s The Methods of Ethics. Although some consider it one of the best books ever written in philosophical ethics (see Broad 1930, 143, Smart 1956, 347, and Parfit 2011, xxxiii), the Methods has a reputation (even amongst admirers) for being heavy going and at times dull and boring. And it’s long. It therefore presents a challenge to readers. Phillips aims to assist those new to the Methods to meet this challenge. 

The difficulty encountered in reading the Methods can in part be traced to Sidgwick’s presentation style and, in particular, to his penchant for constantly refining and qualifying his conclusions in reply to numerous objections. Commenting on this feature of the Methods, C. D. Broad writes that while “admirable”, there is a tendency for readers to become “impatient” and to “lose the thread of the argument” in the face of it (Broad 1930, 144). Phillips aims to forestall this reaction by concisely stating Sidgwick’s arguments when he says too much and by expanding when he says too little. In this way, Phillips illuminates the arguments of the individual chapters of the Methods and of the book as a whole.

Phillips’s book comprises eleven chapters. After an introductory chapter on Sidgwick’s life and career, and the guide’s design, the remaining chapters discuss one or more of the main positions Sidgwick defended in the Methods. Among other things, Phillips covers Sidgwick’s non-naturalist meta-ethics, his intuitionist epistemology, his argument for utilitarianism and for hedonism, his dismissal of common-sense morality, and his dualism of practical reason (involving the conflict between the practical recommendations of rational egoism and utilitarianism). In every case, Phillips’s discussions are excellent. 

To evaluate Phillips’s book, a brief summary of the argument of the Methods is necessary. In the Methods, Sidgwick focuses on methods of ethics: rational procedures “by which we determine what individual human beings ‘ought’—or what it is ‘right’ for them—to do, or to seek to realise by voluntary action” (ME 1).[1] Sidgwick considers three methods: rational egoism, dogmatic intuitionism and utilitarianism.

Rational egoism says

the rational agent regards quantity of consequent pleasure and pain to himself as alone important in choosing between alternatives of action; and seeks always the greatest attainable surplus of pleasure over pain—which . . . we may designate as his ‘greatest happiness.’ (ME 95; also 121)

Dogmatic intuitionism (or common-sense morality) says

certain kinds of actions are right and reasonable in themselves, apart from their consequences;—or rather with a merely partial consideration of consequences, from which other consequences admitted to be possibly good or bad are definitely excluded. (ME 200; also 312–13, 337)

Utilitarianism says

the conduct which, under any given circumstances, is objectively right, is that which will produce the greatest amount of happiness on the whole; that is, taking into account all whose happiness is affected by the conduct. (ME 411)

Sidgwick rejects dogmatic intuitionism because it is too vague to provide comprehensive practical guidance (ME 360–61, 421–22). It says, for example, that you ought to keep your promises, but it fails to say whether this holds where the promisee is dead or where fulfilling the promise will harm the promisee though she does not believe it and insists on the promise being fulfilled. It says that you ought to tell the truth, except to an “invalid” for whom truth might cause a “dangerous shock” or to children on matters “it is thought well that they should not know the truth” (ME 316), though there’s disagreement over the exceptions. To achieve completeness, common sense needs to be supplemented by a more basic and more comprehensive method.

The vagueness is remedied and the exceptions explained by appeal to utilitarianism, which, Sidgwick thinks, “sustains the general validity of the current moral judgements, and [. . .] supplements the defects which reflection finds in the intuitive recognition of their stringency; and at the same time affords a principle of synthesis, and a method for binding the unconnected and occasionally conflicting principles of common moral reasoning in a complete and harmonious system” (ME 422).

Utilitarianism is not, Sidgwick emphasizes, justified by appeal to empirical considerations à  la Bentham and Mill. Sidgwick is no empiricist. Instead, utilitarianism rests (at least in part) on a set of philosophical intuitions or self-evident propositions. Sidgwick thinks utilitarianism results when “the demand for really self-evident first principles is rigorously pressed” (ME 388).

Despite this, Sidgwick finds egoism no less plausible than utilitarianism. He seems to argue that because the distinction between “any one individual and any other is real and fundamental [. . .] ‘I’ am concerned with the quality of my existence as an individual in a sense, fundamentally important, in which I am not concerned with the quality of the existence of other individuals” (ME 498). This is, in any case, the “assumption” on which egoism is based (Sidgwick 1889, 484).

Unfortunately, egoism sometimes permits what utilitarianism forbids (and vice versa). Contrary to utilitarianism, egoism permits lying even when lying is more costly to others than it is beneficial to the egoist. Hence, we arrive at the dualism of practical reason involving a conflict between two equally plausible methods of ethics (ME 496–509).

It is possible that God might be able to resolve the conflict by making utilitarian virtue pay, but, Sidgwick says, he cannot find “any intuition, claiming to be clear and certain, that the performance of duty will be adequately rewarded and its violation punished” (ME 507).

The Methods comprises four books. Sidgwick devotes Books 2, 3, and 4 to an examination of each of the above methods and arguments. In Book 1 he addresses some preliminaries, arguing, among other things, that “ought” is unanalysable, that “good” is analysable in terms of “ought”, that psychological hedonism is false, that resolution of the free will controversy is of limited importance to ethics, and that intuitions are indispensable to ethics.

Phillips addresses these preliminary arguments with aplomb (in chapters 2–4). His discussions are clear and concise. He does an admirable job of relating Sidgwick’s conclusions to work by historical and contemporary philosophers. There are two cases in these chapters where Phillips is especially helpful.

(1) In Chapter 2, Phillips details how, in comparison with G. E. Moore and W. D. Ross, Sidgwick’s conceptual framework allows for consideration of a greater range of normative frameworks (34–38). The most basic moral category for Sidgwick is ought or right; any view employing such concepts is up for consideration. At least in Principia Ethica, Moore thought the most basic moral category was good. He defined “right” in terms of “good”, “right” meaning “cause of a good result” (Moore 1903, 147–48). On this basis, he deemed dogmatic intuitionism false by definition. Ross eschewed consideration of egoism because he thought it did not make sense to say we have a duty to promote our own happiness (Ross 1939, 239).

(2) Sidgwick is an epistemic intuitionist. He says little about why he endorses this view. Phillips finds an argument for it in Sidgwick which he helpfully brings out for the reader (63–65). On Phillips’s reading Sidgwick argues from a commitment to foundationalism about justification and the autonomy of ethics to intuitionism (ME 97–98).[2] The idea is that because no ‘ought’ may be rationally derived (deductively or inductively) from an ‘is’, and justification is foundationalist in nature, if any method (or the principle assumed by any method) is known it must “either be immediately known to be true,—and therefore, we may say, a moral intuition—or be inferred ultimately from premises which include at least one such moral intuition” (ME 98). Phillips follows this clarification with a helpful discussion of Sidgwick’s sometimes misleading classification of the various forms of intuitionism he explores (66–71).

But where Phillips most excels is in chapters 5–11 where he investigates the main arguments summarised above. The most noteworthy chapters are chapter 7 on philosophical intuitionism and chapter 11 on the dualism of practical reason.

In his main discussion (ME Book III, chapter xiii) of the philosophical intuitions on which his argument for utilitarianism relies, Sidgwick is not always clear which claims qualify as self-evident and what, ultimately, they furnish. Sidgwick suggests in some places that he endorses an intuition that might be used to justify rational egoism (ME 391), while in other places he suggests he does not (ME 498). Sidgwick is unclear whether his appeal to intuitions gets him utilitarianism or merely a principle of beneficence (ME 387, 388, 406–07, 421). In chapter 7, Phillips engages these and other issues, drawing out the different interpretive and philosophical options, orienting the reader to exactly what is puzzling about each of them. Phillips thinks it best to interpret Sidgwick as arriving at a prima facie obligation of beneficence (139–40, 142) (in which case further arguments would be needed to secure utilitarianism, some of which Phillips explores in chapter 9). He seems not to think Sidgwick endorses an intuition pertaining to and forming the basis of an argument for egoism (213). Phillips closes the chapter by comparing Sidgwick and Ross on the issue of which principles are self-evident. This chapter is one instance in which Phillips helpfully expands on Sidgwick’s (rather taciturn) discussion.

At the end of chapters 1–8 Phillips includes suggestions for further readings. In chapters 9–11, rather than make such suggestions, he spends a portion of the chapters discussing the secondary literature on the issues in Sidgwick that have attracted the most scholarly and philosophical attention. Phillips provides a clear and accessible account of the state of scholarly play relating to Sidgwick’s meta-ethics, his epistemology, and his dualism of practical reason.

The chapter on the dualism will be especially useful to the uninitiated. There are a number of puzzles surrounding Sidgwick’s conclusion that there exists a dualism of practical reason, including the precise structure and content of the argument for egoism, the precise nature of the conflict between utilitarianism and egoism, and the precise relationship between the dualism and the existence of God. Phillips deftly explains these puzzles and ends with a very effective account of the various options for interpreting the dualism. Phillips suggests that Sidgwick’s main argument for egoism depends on the distinction passage noted above, which, Phillips argues, fails to furnish egoism. Rather, (at best) it gets Sidgwick “special” but not (what is necessary for egoism) “exclusive” concern for the self (215). On this basis, Phillips argues for a reading of the dualism on which it involves a conflict between a prima facie duty to promote universal good and a prima facie duty to promote one’s own good on the whole (227–31).

The series in which Phillips’s book is published—the Oxford Guides to Philosophy series—aims to provide “concise introductions to the most important primary texts in the history of philosophy [. . . and to] guide readers through these challenging texts”. Phillips endeavours to help individuals navigate their way through the Methods (14).

Phillips meets these goals. His book will likely work best in advanced undergraduate and graduate seminars on Sidgwick or the history of utilitarianism or nineteenth- and twentieth-century moral philosophy (featuring especially Moore, Ross and Broad). It contains a decent bibliography and a helpful glossary of terms.

It is a testament to how difficult the Methods is to engage that many works on it in part function as guides to it. In terms of clearly and comprehensively conveying in plain language the main arguments of the Methods and the interpretive and philosophical controversies germane to them, Phillips is unrivalled. His book is better organized and more comprehensive than Hayward (1901) and Broad (1930); it does not labour to situate Sidgwick historically or defend a unique interpretation of the Methods like Schneewind (1977); it is not fixated on reconstructing and defending Sidgwick’s argument for utilitarianism like de Lazari-Radek and Singer (2014); it is not invested in showing (broadly) which theses in the Methods are true and important like Crisp (2015).[3] Instead, Phillips’s book provides readers with a solid and (relatively) neutral basis for engaging such works.

There are a number of places in which Phillips could have said more. I note three.

(1) Sidgwick is a hedonist: pain is the only non-instrumental evil; pleasure is the only non-instrumental good. His argument for hedonism in ME Book III, chapter xiv is a mess.[4] Phillips does a marvelous job in chapter 8 of clarifying Sidgwick’s (multistage) defence of hedonism, which involves rejecting the view that virtue is the sole good as well as value pluralism, and appealing to intuition to support hedonism while deflecting common-sense objections to it.

In chapter 8, Phillips discusses whether hedonism is one of Sidgwick’s philosophical intuitions (157–58). He seems to concede it is. He makes the intriguing claim that hedonism has a “lower level of certainty” (158) compared with the philosophical intuitions in ME Book III, chapter xiii (which Phillips outlines in chapter 7).[5] This assessment emerges from his interpretation of the criteria Sidgwick uses to segregate philosophical intuitions from “mere opinions” (ME 338). According to these criteria, a philosophical intuition must be clear and precise, self-evident on reflection, consistent with other propositions considered self-evident, and (roughly) not denied by an epistemic peer (100–04, 152; ME 338–42). Phillips thinks, for Sidgwick, satisfying these criteria “will yield something, certainty, which comes in degrees [. . . .] Some principles will [. . .  therefore] turn out to be more certain than others” (101).

Phillips does not say exactly why he thinks that on these criteria it transpires that hedonism is less certain than the other intuitions to which Sidgwick appeals. It might be due to the peer disagreement Phillips notes (154–57). It would have been helpful to learn about this, for two reasons. First, it would clarify Phillips’s reading of the function of the criteria for self-evidence. Second, it would serve as an enticement to explore whether it is plausible to think the philosophical intuitions Sidgwick accepts possess equal degrees of certainty. One reason to think they do not, on Phillips’s understanding of the criteria, is that there is more disagreement about some than others. Suppose, as seems plausible, that Sidgwick accepts an axiom of prudence: one ought to aim at one’s good on the whole. This axiom might not possess the same degree of certainty as the axiom of beneficence. After all, one of Sidgwick’s heroes—Bishop Joseph Butler—agrees with prudence, but one of his other heroes—Kant—does not. Both seem to agree with his axioms of justice and beneficence.

(2) Sidgwick offers a novel view of pleasure, distinguishing himself, it seems, from his utilitarian predecessors. His official definition of pleasure equates it with a feeling that when felt is “at least implicitly apprehended as desirable” (ME 127; also 131). But occasionally he equates pleasure with “desirable consciousness” (ME 129, 398, 402). Phillips replicates the unclarity. He notes the official view (86), but at various places in the book describes Sidgwick as holding the view that pleasure is “desirable feeling” (89; also 149).

This is important. At one point, Sidgwick says that if we accept his definition of pleasure, it is a tautology that pleasure is good (ME 129). But this would follow for him only if pleasure is defined as desirable feeling, since, for Sidgwick, “desirable” means “good”. But this would not be true if, for him, pleasure is defined as feelings apprehended to be desirable. It is not a tautology to say feelings apprehended to be desirable are in fact desirable.

Phillips does not address this unclarity or its philosophical ramifications. It bears on his point about conceptual openness mentioned above in relation to Moore and Ross. At one point Sidgwick considers the Stoic who denies that pleasure is good (ME 129). The Stoic might be wrong about this, but the Stoic is not, it seems, making a conceptual error which would follow—and perhaps unfairly condemn the Stoic—were it true that pleasure is defined as desirable consciousness. Phillips here misses an opportunity to clarify Sidgwick’s (novel) view of pleasure and its implications.[6]

(3) In ME Book IV, chapter i, Sidgwick clarifies the structure of utilitarianism. He confronts the issue of what utilitarians should say in cases where the options open to them appear tied in terms of surplus happiness. To deal with this kind of case he claims utilitarianism needs to be supplemented by “some principle of Just or Right Distribution of [. . .] happiness” (ME 416–17). The principle he opts for says, following Bentham, that each counts for one and no one for more than one (ME 417). He thinks this favours the option with the more equitable distribution of happiness in cases where the options available produce equal quantities of surplus happiness (ME 416–17).

Phillips briefly discusses this in chapter 9, but (surprisingly) offers no comment (165–66). Students are likely to be puzzled by Sidgwick’s introduction of a principle of right distribution. Indeed, Sidgwick’s claim is puzzling for four reasons. First, it not clear that Bentham’s principle favours equitable distributions. Both equitable and inequitable distributions seem capable of satisfying it. Second, if utilitarianism needs to be supplemented, it is not complete and therefore not (contrary to Sidgwick) a full picture of morality (Irwin 2009, 513–14). Third, if the principle of equality has a source independent of utilitarianism, the possibility of a conflict between it and utilitarianism arises in cases where utilitarianism justifies inequitable distributions of happiness. Fourth, if utilitarianism needs to be supplemented by another principle, it seems no better than common-sense morality which, Sidgwick urges, is unclear and imprecise in practice and (to its discredit) in need of supplementation.[7] In not broaching this topic, Phillips overlooks an opportunity to explore utilitarianism’s troubled relationship with equality owing to its theoretical insensitivity to the distribution of happiness (see Wallace 1988 and Skelton 2019).

Sidgwick’s fans, including Crisp (2015), Parfit (2011), Phillips (2011), and de Lazari-Radek and Singer (2014), want the Methods to be more widely read and better understood. Although not the only guide to the Methods, Phillips’s book seems well placed to satisfy this want about Sidgwick’s masterpiece.


I wish to thank Isra Black, David Phillips, Robert Shaver, and Wayne Sumner for helpful comments on earlier versions of this review.


Crisp, Roger. The Cosmos of Duty: Henry Sidgwick’s Methods of Ethics. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2015.

De Lazari-Radek, Katarzyna and Singer, Peter. The Point of View of the Universe: Sidgwick and Contemporary Ethics. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2014.

Hayward, F. H. The Ethical Philosophy of Sidgwick. London: Swan Sonnenschein, 1901.

Irwin, Terence. The Development of Ethics, vol. 3: From Kant to Rawls. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2009.

Moore, G. E. Principia Ethica. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1903.

Parfit, Derek. On What Matters, volume one. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2011.

Phillips, David. Sidgwickian Ethics. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2011.

Ross, W. D. Foundations of Ethics. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1939.

Schneewind, J. B. Sidgwick’s Ethics and Victorian Moral Philosophy. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1977.

Shaver, Robert. “Sidgwick on Virtue,” Etica & Politica / Ethics & Politics 10 (2008), 210–25.

Shaver, Robert. “Sidgwick’s Axioms and Consequentialism,” Philosophical Review 123 (2014), 173–204.

Shaver, Robert. “Sidgwick on Pleasure,” Ethics 126 (2016), 901–28.

Sidgwick, Henry. “Some Fundamental Ethical Controversies,” Mind 14 (1889), 473–87.

Sidgwick, Henry. The Methods of Ethics, seventh edition. Indianapolis, IN: Hackett, 1981 [1907].

Skelton, Anthony. “Sidgwick’s Philosophical Intuitions,” Etica & Politica / Ethics & Politics 10 (2008), 185–209.

Skelton, Anthony. “Late Utilitarian Moral Theory and its Development: Sidgwick, Moore,” in A Companion to Nineteenth-Century Philosophy, ed., John Shand. Oxford: Wiley-Blackwell, 2019, pp. 281–310.

Skelton, Anthony. Sidgwick’s Ethics. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, forthcoming.

Smart, J. J. C. “Extreme and Restricted Utilitarianism,” Philosophical Quarterly 25 (1956), 344–54.

Sturgeon, Nicholas. “Ethical Intuitionism and Ethical Naturalism,” in Ethical Intuitionism: Re-evaluations, ed., Philip Stratton-Lake. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2002, pp. 184–211.

Wallace, James D. “The Passive Conception of Practical Reasoning,” in Moral Relevance and Moral Conflict. Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 1988, pp. 24–49.

[1] ME is an abbreviation of Sidgwick 1981 [1907].

[2] For more detailed accounts of this argument, see Phillips 2011, 53–59 and Sturgeon 2002.

[3] Nor does it function to rehearse the scholarly and critical arguments of Phillips 2011.

[4] Shaver 2008 provides the best scholarly investigation of Sidgwick’s argument for hedonism, though Phillips neglects to cite it.

[5] These include, among others:

The axiom of justice

it cannot be right for A to treat B in a manner in which it would be wrong for B to treat A, merely on the ground that they are two different individuals, and without there being any difference between the natures or circumstances of the two which can be stated as a reasonable ground for difference of treatment. (ME 380)

The axiom of personal irrelevance

the good of any one individual is of no more importance, from the point of view (if I may say so) of the Universe, than the good of any other; unless, that is, there are special grounds for believing that more good is likely to be realised in the one case than in the other. (ME 382)

The axiom of beneficence

as a rational being I am bound to aim at good generally—so far as it is attainable by my efforts—not merely at a particular part of it. (ME 382)

For full discussion of Sidgwick’s philosophical intuitions, see Skelton 2008, Shaver 2014, and Skelton (forthcoming).

[6] The best discussions of Sidgwick on pleasure are Schneewind 1977, 315–22 and Shaver 2016.

[7] Sidgwick’s supplementation of utilitarianism might supply the needed clarity and precision. However, this only defers the problem for utilitarianism. The view may still lack clarity and precision in cases where the available options appear tied in terms of surplus happiness and in terms of how equitably happiness is distributed