Sight and Sensibility: Evaluating Pictures

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Dominic McIver Lopes, Sight and Sensibility: Evaluating Pictures, Oxford University Press, 2005, 224pp, $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199277346.

Reviewed by Katerina Bantinaki, University of Manchester


Contemporary analytic studies of pictorial representation focus mainly on the representational function of pictures: they aim to explain how pictures represent and how pictorial representation relates to other types of representation. In Sight and Sensibility Dominic Lopes aims to extend the scope of pictorial theory: pictures are here examined not as vehicles of representation but as objects of evaluation.

The aim that informs Sight and Sensibility is to provide a defence of aesthetic interactionism, i.e., of the doctrine that aesthetic evaluations of pictures sometimes imply and sometimes are implied by non-aesthetic evaluations, in particular cognitive and moral evaluations. With this project Lopes addresses a hot dispute in the domain of criticism: with the resources of analytic philosophy he aims to provide an informed answer to the question of whether a critic who allows cognitive and moral considerations to play a role in arriving at an aesthetic evaluation of a picture conforms to, rather than violates, the norms of aesthetic criticism.

The common trait between the distinct types of evaluation under consideration -- which sets them apart from other types of evaluation not considered by Lopes, as for instance appreciation of commercial value -- is taken to be that they are all evaluations of pictures as pictures: that is, they are all evaluations of pictures as vehicles for seeing-in, as entities that allow the observer to have visual experiences of the objects and scenes they depict. This commitment, given Lopes' primary task, sets a second aim for his analysis: to provide an account of the way in which pictures are vehicles for seeing-in, that is, to 'explain what it is for pictures to elicit experiences of the scenes they depict' (p.11). It is on this latter aim that Lopes focuses in the first two chapters of Sight and Sensibility in order to set the stage for his primary concern, the defence of interactionism.

Given Lopes' interest in evaluation, the first challenge that he thinks has to be met with regard to the pictorial experience is the following: to specify how seeing in pictures is significantly similar to and yet significantly different from face-to-face seeing in respect of the scene-presenting experiences they involve. This challenge is set by the 'puzzle of mimesis': the fact that 'some pictures are worth looking at partly in so far as they prompt scene-presenting experiences and yet face-to-face experiences of the same scenes are less worth having' (p.23). The challenge can be met, according to Lopes, if we acknowledge how seeing O in a picture relates to seeing O face-to-face; in particular if we acknowledge that (a) the two kinds of experience are similar to the extent that they both involve the exercise of the visual concept O (where a visual concept O is 'an ability to reliably identify O by its visual appearance in varying circumstances' (p.46)); and (b) they are different to the extent that in seeing O in a picture, in contrast to seeing O face-to-face, one is visually aware at the same time -- or in alternating acts in the case of trompe l'oeil pictures -- of features of the picture's surface: either features in virtue of which the surface depicts what it does (in which case seeing-in doubles with 'design' seeing), or features not directly relevant to depiction, as for instance that it is a canvas (in which case seeing-in doubles with surface seeing).

The distinction that Lopes suggests between design seeing and surface seeing as different aspects of awareness with which seeing-in pictures can double, is a useful tool in our understanding of the twofold character of pictorial seeing across different kinds of pictorial representation; it is thus of explanatory value independently of its role in solving the puzzle of mimesis. A worry that might arise however with regard to the suggested account of pictorial seeing is that, as the account stands, it is incomplete: Lopes accepts that seeing O in a picture and seeing O face-to-face call for the exercise of the same visual concept O, of the same capacity to recognize O by its appearance; at the same time, however, he argues against resemblance and experienced-resemblance theories that attempt to pinpoint the properties shared between the relevant objects of seeing thus calling for the exercise of the same visual concept. For Lopes' account to succeed the explanation that resemblance theories can offer has to be replaced by a different kind of explanation, one that Lopes does not here provide, thus undermining the explanatory scope of his theory.

The second step in the analysis of pictures as vehicles for seeing-in relates to their expressive potential. We can see in pictures not just the scenes they depict but also the emotions, feelings, and moods they express. Expression has generated much discourse in analytic aesthetics: expression entails connection of the physical configuration to an emotion, but when the vehicle of expression is the design or the depicted scene rather than a figure depicted in that scene, there seems to be no person to whom the emotion can be attributed. Opposing alternative accounts of expression -- personalism and arousalism -- Lopes attempts to solve the 'missing person' problem by denying that expression needs a person to whom the emotion expressed is attributable. Rather, he argues, 'the physical configuration of a picture's design, or the figure or scene a picture depicts, expresses E if and only if (1) it is an expression look that (2) has the function, in the circumstances, of indicating E' (p.78). The merit of Lopes' proposal is its simplicity in relation to alternative accounts of expression, and also the fact that it provides a unified explanation of different types of expression by pictures (i.e., design, scene, and figure expression). Again, however, the proposal has a limited explanatory scope: to gain a full understanding of expression we would need to have an understanding of the mechanisms by means of which any given physical configuration assumes the function of indicating an emotion. Lopes acknowledges this point but argues that ignorance about the mechanisms is no reason to reject the suggested theory of expression. That may be so, but it still is the case that until we have an understanding of the mechanisms, if such mechanisms exist, we have no good reason to accept the theory as true either.

Having considered what it is for pictures to be vehicles for seeing-in, Lopes has set the stage for his main task, the defence of interactionism. The next necessary task, which he undertakes in Chapter 3, is to distinguish aesthetic evaluations from non-aesthetic ones. An evaluation R of P as F is an aesthetic evaluation, Lopes argues, 'if and only if (1) were R accurate being F would be (de)merit in P, all else being equal; (2) a suitable observer's experience E of P as F is partly constitutive of (1); and (3) R is an experience with the same content as E or R is a representation warranted by E' (p.107). The important point in this account, and what sets it apart from alternative accounts, is that the experience of seeing value is taken to be internal to aesthetic evaluation (rather than merely the source of such evaluation): aesthetic evaluation, for Lopes, sometimes amounts to seeing value, it takes the form of experiences of pictures as valuable.

In the concluding chapters of Sight and Sensibility Lopes provides a lucid and insightful account of the cognitive and moral value of pictures that illustrates well their internal link to aesthetic value. With regard to cognitive value, he draws attention to the fact that pictures foster or reinforce some cognitive abilities through the demands that they make on viewers. For instance, looking at a picture frequently requires effort, attention to detail, accurate perception, and adaptable seeing. In order to meet such demands viewers must become fine observers. Fine observation is an intellectual virtue that can be fostered or reinforced by looking at pictures, and those pictures that boost fine observation have cognitive merit. With regard to moral value, on the other hand, Lopes illustrates with apt examples how pictures can contribute to moral sensibility as vehicles for seeing-in by allowing us to exercise and, sometimes, to acquire or realign our moral concepts. The moral value of pictures, accordingly, depends on the impact that their mimetic contents have on their viewers' moral concepts. Both in the case of cognitive value and in the case of moral value there is an internal link to aesthetic evaluation -- thereby affirming interactionism -- in the case that the viewer's experience of value is constitutive of the cognitive or moral (de)merit of the pictorial work. In those cases part of the boost that the picture provides to a viewer's cognitive capacities and moral sensibilities comes from the viewer's experience of the boost as a merit, to the extent that such experience triggers a motivation to exercise the relevant faculties.

Sight and Sensibility is most certainly a focused, lucid, and meticulous study of the nature of pictorial value that offers the reader valuable resources with which to approach troublesome dilemmas in the domain of criticism (a case in point being the feminist criticism of the male gaze in pictures, which Lopes considers in the concluding chapter of the book). The great merit of Sight and Sensibility is that it provides a subtle and convincing account of the manner in which different types of value interact, an account that is sensitive to, and thus brings forth, fine aspects of our encounter with pictorial works and the impact of such an encounter on our sensibilities. Admittedly, the claims put forth in the analysis of pictures as vehicles for seeing-in are, at points, more casually argued than one would have wished, but still, they are insightful and certainly point to directions that we might have good reasons to explore. Although Sight and Sensibility centres around the value of pictures, I trust that it will be of interest to readers concerned with matters of evaluation not just of pictorial art but of all kinds of art, due to the unified and comprehensive conception of value that it offers -- a conception that places our humane concerns about works of art firmly in the (traditionally insulated) domain of aesthetic appreciation.