Signals: Evolution, Learning, and Information

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Brian Skyrms, Signals: Evolution, Learning, and Information, Oxford University Press, 2010, 199pp., $27.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780199582945.

Reviewed by Cedric Paternotte, University of Bristol


Signals are ubiquitous in nature. But what is a signal, and how could the members of so many species end up being able to successfully send and interpret signals -- or alternatively, what is meaning and how can it appear? These are the two questions that Brian Skyrms tackles in his most recent book, mostly focusing on the latter. Perhaps unsurprisingly, there is no complete answer yet. However, Skyrms argues that at least elements of the correct answer now seem within reach. Most of the book consists in a progressive exposition of tools and conceptual ideas (borrowed from a wide palette of theories) which are likely to be part of such an explanation.

The paradigmatic situations that Skyrms analyzes are modeled by Lewisian signaling games, that is, games where senders observe states of the world and can send signals to receivers who in turn must choose an act. The theorist's goal is then to find ways by which either a learning process or an evolutionary one can lead to the appearance of efficient signaling systems -- systems in which receivers choose actions that maximize their payoffs or their fitness depending on the actual state of the world. How could signals, which may only be more or less random sounds in the beginning, end up being well correlated both with states of the world and with actions?

The sheer variety of cases and models that Skyrms considers asks for a rather detailed summary. The book contains fourteen reasonably short, varied chapters, which can be roughly divided up in thematic parts. The first chapter lays out Skyrms' project: to understand natural meaning (that is, meaning which 'depends on associations arising from natural processes', p. 1) by using Lewis' signaling games, evolution theory, information theory, trial-and-error learning and networks. Chapter 2 reviews evidence that every characteristic of natural meaning to be described, or at least some rudimentary form thereof, can already be found among animal species. Signal use is flexible; signals can be interspecific and manifest some syntactic structure. The fact that certain signals are salient -- that they resemble what they signal -- is not a necessary property. Chapter 3 contains Skyrms' naturalistic definition of meaning, or rather information content (to be detailed below). This in turn allows one to measure the efficiency of a signaling system.

Chapters 4-6 adopt an evolutionary point of view, from which signaling games turn out to be structurally unstable: small variations in structure can drastically affect their dynamics. From this point on, Skyrms studies cases of increasing complexity and decreasing degree of idealization, starting with the elementary case of two equiprobable states of the world, two signals and two acts. One can then fiddle with the number of states, signals or acts, as well as considering states with unequal probabilities. Signaling systems can be evolutionary equilibria, but so can 'pooling equilibria': cases in which senders send identical signals whatever the state of the world is and receivers choose the same act regardless of the signal. To evolutionarily justify signaling systems, one must explain how pooling equilibria can be avoided or at least rendered improbable. Introducing correlated encounters, or rates of mutation, partially helps. Skyrms then discusses cases of misinformation and deception, showing that, contrary to intuition, there exist some equilibria in which all signals are deceptive (or 'half-truths', as Skyrms puts it): they do not inform about the actual state of the world.

Chapters 7-10 bring learning theory into the mix, distinguishing between two kinds of learning (differing about the speed with which agents settle upon a strategy). Like evolution, learning processes can explain the stabilization of signaling systems, but here the results are seldom analytical and mostly emerge from simulations. Again, unequal probabilities of states and more complex games lead to difficulties, which most of the time can be overcome by adjusting parameters. Skyrms then studies two extensions of the previous models. First, some signaling systems can contain synonyms (several signals corresponding to the same state) or bottlenecks (one signal for several states). Secondly, by considering invention of new signals, he shows that reinforcement learning can lead to the appearance of signals themselves.

Finally, chapters 11-14 tackle the role played by networks in signal transmissions. After considering the interaction of signals -- giving some hints about how logical combinations of signals can themselves become signals -- the emphasis is put on the interaction of agents. In different cases of teamwork-homeostasis, dialogue-signaling systems can still appear. But the more interesting models are those in which network formations themselves evolve. A ring is the optimal shape for a network; it can appear at the price of some sophistication of the models. When it does not, many mechanisms lead instead to a star-shaped network.

Lewis introduced signaling games in Convention (1969) in order to justify the existence of conventions of language without falling into circularity, that is, without presupposing previously existing conventions. Ironically, even if the use of some of his conceptual tools has become widespread (e.g., his definition of common knowledge or convention, as well as signaling games, of course), Lewis' goal has been rather neglected. Skyrms gives Lewis much more than the customary lip service (ch. 11), and although their approaches are distinct, they are also complementary to a certain extent. Skyrms aims to explain natural meaning (that is to say meaning itself since for him 'all meaning is natural meaning', p. 1), of which conventional meaning is a subspecies. But while Lewis concentrated on a definition of conventions based on rational and epistemic conditions, Skyrms is interested in explaining the appearance of meaning in general and systematically downplays the extent to which rationality and complex epistemic attitudes are needed. Not only does it not matter whether conventions are characterized in a Lewisian way, but the learning processes that lead to them can also be attained by low-rationality agents following simple heuristics (ch. 8).

This stance is by no means unfortunate and mirrors the changes that game theory as a whole has witnessed during the past two decades, clearly shifting from an emphasis on epistemic aspects of equilibria to a focus on evolutionary processes -- this reflects the well-known distinction between proximate and ultimate explanations. The usual snag is that the link between those two accounts of convention is left unanalyzed. If conventions can be a result of processes which are cognitively undemanding, why is it that they are typically defined by complex sets of intertwined epistemic conditions? Skyrms seems to be raising our expectations concerning this issue (see the end of ch. 7) but does not discuss it, which can be judged as a drawback or as an asset of the book depending on one's taste as to whether epistemic issues should be altogether absent from evolutionary explanations.

However, it would be incorrect to imply that Skyrms is content with applying an evolutionary framework to a topic which was originally dealt with by using analytic tools. For he also refuses to take for granted the classical signaling games, however useful, and he ceaselessly wonders about whether any result would be conserved if the games were enriched or if one started being interested in the evolution of the signaling games themselves. Skyrms does certainly look the gift horse in the mouth, and one of the book's strengths is that hardly any model is left unchallenged. A full-fledged evolutionary analysis of signaling should not only use signaling games but should also explain how signals could appear in the first place. Again, this attitude, which is made clear from the outset ('Signaling games themselves evolve', p. 2), is not dissimilar to a recent trend in another part of the literature on evolutionary theory, namely that concerning evolutionary transitions, according to which it is not deemed sufficient to presuppose that evolutionary entities are hierarchically nested -- how such a hierarchy itself arose has to be explained in the first place. In other words, for Skyrms it is not enough to substitute analytical definitions for evolutionary accounts. The latter also have to be as thorough as possible, that is, each of the elements that constitute them has to receive its own evolutionary explanation. This is a praiseworthy attitude.

Now for the solutions themselves. The array of mechanisms that can lead to the emergence of signaling systems turns out to be quite vast. In the case of evolutionary processes, allowing for mutations and correlated interactions can sometimes eliminate pooling equilibria. In the case of learning processes, adjusting the parameters of a learning process (e.g., choosing to consider an 'exponential response', p. 99) helps, as well as introducing signal invention and noisy forgetting. Neural nets, imitation and networks can also be summoned to produce efficient signaling. In some cases, no solutions are available yet. In other words, Skyrms provides nuts and bolts that lead to partial solutions allowing signaling to emerge, or at least to emerge most of the time, but the general picture is lacking.

Far from staying in the abstract, Skyrms practices empirically-informed philosophy and never hesitates to base the models he discusses on multiple examples of signaling, ranging from ape eavesdropping and bird syntax to quorum-sensing bacteria. Sure enough, there is abundant evidence about various explanatory factors, but what the evidence does not tell us much about is how these factors interact. As they are introduced as partial remedies which work in specific contexts, when it comes to explaining signaling in a new situation, one must either combine some previously obtained factors or find a new one. In other words, little is said about how the factors can be combined or about how many of them we should introduce. It is sometimes hard to shake the feeling that since we are exploring many possibilities, the underlying philosophical lesson is lacking. Bring in invention of new signals, the rate of which you can calibrate. If too many signals are created, bring in some noisy forgetting, the degree of which can be adjusted. As mechanisms and parameters multiply, explanatory power decreases and ad hocness looms large.

Note that this is not a criticism of the book's enterprise. If general solutions and satisfying analytic accounts do not exist yet, we have to make do with what is available, in this case simulations, and grope our way along. Skyrms understands this perfectly, and the book is explicitly presented as a work in progress, clarifying the basic issues and suggesting basic models that call on further elaboration: 'We now have a simple, tractable model [that] invites all sorts of interesting variations.' (p. 135) Moreover, that a multitude of partial solutions exist is not specific to signaling, but rather is testimony to the motley aspect of most evolutionary explanations today: most of the factors which can explain a phenomenon appear to be well identified, but the specifics about how they actually interacted or to what extent some of them were purely contingent are not. Have analytic solutions collapsed into simulations and should we mainly look for 'recurrent patterns [to] emerg[e]' (p. 177)? On topics plagued by high complexity, maybe there is no other avenue for philosophy to take.

A small digression here: one virtue according to which a philosopher can assess a model is its robustness. The bigger the range of variation of parameters that preserve a given result, the more acceptable becomes a model that contains many parameters; likewise when a large number of similar models provide similar results. Skyrms makes clear that his exploration of various models, especially in the case of learning processes, is driven by the need for a robust explanation of the emergence of signaling (e.g., p. 93). But the emphasis put on robustness can only be a second-best strategy. For instance, Skyrms mentions at one point favorable results obtained when a model has been calibrated in order to fit experimental data about learning (p. 100; but he notes that different competing models equally fit the data). Surely, once this happens there is no need to care about robustness with respect to the model's parameters. The robustness of a model is to then be understood as correlated to the prior probability that things happened this way, or that the factors involved actually played a role. In other words, robustness supplies a priori, revisable reasons to choose a model before empirical evidence steers us towards a more restricted range of parameters.

Apart from these evolutionary considerations, Skyrms makes several claims pertaining to more classical philosophical issues. However, they are likely to make some philosophers cringe, because they are both deceptively simple and unabashedly provocative. First, his model in which all signals are half-truths is hailed as a counterexample to Kant's claim that universal deception is impossible. Although the model is surely interesting, its sting becomes less acute when one realizes that half-truths are not completely deceptive and that Skyrms adopts a naturalistic definition of deception that strips it of its intentional dimension. It might also have been interesting to see how the degree of shared interests influences how general deception can be. Secondly and more importantly, Skyrms also provides a naturalistic account of meaning as informational content that refines possible-world semantics. To classical meaning, qualitatively defined as a proposition (a set of possible worlds), Skyrms adds a quantitative dimension that conveys the amount by which a signal would affect the objective probabilities of possible states, that is, the list of the quantity of information it would carry in every possible state. However, the extremely brief remainder of the chapter that follows does not discuss the philosophical implications of this claim, which is, disappointingly, never to be touched upon again. Whereas there is virtue in introducing ideas and concepts with a certain levity -- Skyrms' tone is continuously and pleasantly off-hand -- the downside is that one sometimes wishes the meal was heartier.

In a nutshell, the book is reader-friendly, as all basic concepts (evolution, reinforcement learning, networks, etc.) are clearly presented. Skyrms provides the bulk of the explanations, referring to papers for most technical details. The book partly offers a survey of existing literature, on which it adopts a bird's eye-view, and partly presents the author's personal insights. It treads the fine line between non-formal discussion and an exposition of the gist of the main technical results. Overall, this is an extremely stimulating introduction to a fast growing literature, most of which calls upon further contributions. 'How do these results generalize? This is not so much a single question as an invitation to explore an emerging field.' (p. 19) The book is impressively successful in demonstrating the sheer variety of links that signals have to many philosophical themes, as well as the daring scope for future work. One can only hope that this signal is successfully received.