Significance and System: Essays on Kant's Ethics

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Mark Timmons, Significance and System: Essays on Kant's Ethics, Oxford University Press, 2017, 352 pp., $78.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190203368.

Reviewed by Ralf M. Bader, Merton College, University of Oxford


This book brings together ten essays by Mark Timmons (three of them co-authored with Houston Smit). The book has three parts: (1) 'Interpreting the Categorical Imperative' contains four essays that focus on the role of the categorical imperative. (2) 'Motive, Rightness, and Virtue' consists of four essays (two co-authored) which focus on the Doctrine of Virtue, explicating the way in which various specific duties are grounded in the categorical imperative, in particular in the humanity formula, as well as providing detailed discussions of particular duties, most notably the duty of gratitude. (3) 'The Psychology of Moral Evil' contains two essays (one co-authored and another previously unpublished) that are concerned with Kant's account of evil in the Religion and that attempt to explicate the variety and breadth of different types of evil, as well as to reconcile different degrees of evil at the empirical level with a commitment to rigorism at the transcendental level. The essays combine careful scholarship with insightful philosophical analysis. Due to considerations of space, this review will focus on the main line of argumentation that runs through parts 1 and 2.

After having identified the categorical imperative as the supreme principle of morality, Kant puts forward a number of variant formulations (the formula of the law of nature, the formula of humanity, and the formula of the kingdom of ends). One of the central problems for Kant interpreters is to explain how these formulations relate to each other and what role they are meant to play. In chapter 2, Timmons argues that the formulas are meant to fulfil different roles. In particular, the law of nature formula is downgraded to a mere decision procedure. It is taken to constitute a test that we can employ in deliberation and evaluation. Although it is (generally) a reliable guide, it does not identify the features in virtue of which actions are right or wrong, but is only correlated with these features. The criterion of right, instead, is provided by the humanity formula. It identifies the right- and wrong-making features and thereby explains what makes it the case that actions have their respective deontic statuses.

Timmons not only downgrades universalisability to a mere decision procedure, but also argues that it is not sufficient by itself, but dependent on the formula of humanity. His argument begins with the claim that universalisation approaches have to address the problem of moral relevance. Since actions can be described in various ways, one needs to provide an account as to how actions are to be described. In particular, one needs to explain which aspects of actions are relevant and form part of the content of the maxim that is to be universalised and which aspects are to be left out and are properly ignored. If the description is either too abstract or too specific, then the maxim will be universalisable for the wrong reason. Timmons accepts that if one is concerned with subjective rightness, then one can follow O'Neill's proposal and consider all those features that are part of the agent's subjective principle of action to be relevant. However, if one also wants to have an account of objective rightness, then it would seem that one requires an external criterion of relevance. Timmons argues that the problem of moral relevance can be solved by means of the notion of humanity. Since humanity is the criterion of right, it determines which features make an action right or wrong. It is these right- and wrong-making features that also determine what is relevant and needs to be included in the description of an action. The proposal is thus to understand objective rightness by means of the universalisability of a maxim described in terms of the objective right- and wrong-making features that are picked out by the criterion of right, namely the formula of humanity.

Timmons, however, goes on to argue in chapter 3 that, even when supplemented by a theory of moral relevance, the universal law formula is nevertheless inadequate. The problem, in particular, is that it does not enable us to end up with verdicts that have sufficient determinacy. The formula of universal law, accordingly, is not a perfectly reliable guide and is not capable of always reaching the correct verdict. This means that the co-extensiveness of the different formulas is to be rejected. Whilst arguing that it is not a perfect guide, Timmons suggests in chapter 4 that the universal law formula is nevertheless useful. On the one hand, it is useful in practice insofar as it highlights the duplicity in agents who make exceptions for themselves. On the other, it is philosophically significant since it identifies various formal constraints, which Timmons labels 'law-likeness', 'supremacy' and 'respect', that fundamental right-making features must have and that lead us to the humanity formulation, which Timmons takes to be the fundamental substantive principle that constitutes the core of Kant's ethics.

The main upshot of part 1 is thus meant to be that universalisability is not capable of playing a foundational role but needs to be supplemented. One cannot get substantive moral conclusions out of a formal universalisability principle. In order to generate substantive conclusions, content needs to be provided that adds constraints that go beyond the merely formal requirement not to make exceptions for oneself. Timmons argues that this additional content is provided by the notion of humanity. Instead of the universal law formula, it is the humanity formula that does all the foundational work. The primary goal of part 2 is to spell out how one can derive the various duties of virtue from the humanity formula.

Chapter 6 (co-authored with Smit) is concerned with the derivation of duties of virtue from this formula, both duties to oneself (qua animal being as well as qua rational being) and duties to others (duties of love as well as duties of respect). This derivation project is not merely understood in terms of classifying various actions as right or wrong but in terms of explaining what makes these actions right or wrong. The project of deriving specific duties from the formula of humanity is rendered difficult by the fact that the idea of treating humanity as an end in itself rather than merely as a means would appear to be too abstract, indeterminate and vague. Timmons and Smit try to address this worry by identifying various 'specification principles' that specify the abstract principle that we have to respect humanity. These specification principles provide determinate content to the requirement of respecting humanity and thereby make possible the derivation of specific duties. Whilst Timmons and Smit make important progress in illuminating and explaining the various duties that Kant discusses in the Doctrine of Virtue and go into much more detail than commentators usually do,[1] the specification principles, which play a crucial role in the derivations, do not stand up to scrutiny.

One concern about the specification principles is that too much is built into them, so that instead of deriving duties from an abstract principle, one simply builds in the results that one wants to end up with.[2] Whilst Timmons and Smit are aware of this issue (cf. the 'criterion of independence', p. 179), it is not clear that they suitably deal with it. This is especially worrisome when it comes to a principle they call 'impartiality'. From the idea of moral equality, which amounts to the claim that all rational agents have equal moral status, one is meant to arrive at (both a positive and a negative) principle of impartiality:

facts about my humanity provide not only me with normative reason to adopt general ends and more specific maxims of action, but those same facts about my humanity provide anyone who is relevantly situated with such reasons to adopt ends and more specific maxims, and vice versa. That is, such considerations provide reasons to acknowledge in maxims and action the claims that the morally legitimate ends of others (particularly their needs) have on us. (p. 187)

This rather substantive impartiality principle, however, does not follow from the commitment to the abstract and formal idea of moral equality. Having equal moral status does not imply that everyone who is similarly situated has reasons to adopt and pursue general ends. More importantly, this, in turn, does not imply that anyone has reasons to pursue the legitimate ends of others and that one agent's ends can give rise to claims on other agents. A situation in which everyone only has reasons to pursue their own ends is perfectly compatible with a commitment to moral equality. Rather than being derived from the idea of moral equality, this impartiality principle, which effectively builds in something that is very close to the duty of beneficence, appears to be simply stipulated.

Relatedly, two problems arise when it comes to the supposed derivation of the duty of beneficence from the principle of impartiality. First, as they note, "this principle presupposes that there are humanity-based reasons for individuals to set and strive to achieve ends" (p. 207). This, however, is problematic. The ends that are to be promoted through beneficence are meant to be discretionary ends. They are desire-based, not humanity-based. This brings out that the impartiality principle put forward by Timmons and Smit (let alone the idea of moral equality) is not a suitable principle for deriving beneficence. Far from it being the case that the reasons are shared by everyone who is relevantly situated, there is a crucial difference between the reasons that an agent has to pursue his or her own ends and the reasons that people have to be beneficent. The reasons that I have to pursue my ends are desire-based, yet the reasons that others have to help me in the pursuit of my ends are humanity-based.

Second, humanity-based reasons, which derive from non-discretionary ends, are meant to be superior to desire-based reasons, which derive from discretionary ends. Yet, it is not clear how this is meant to apply to an imperfect duty, such as the duty of beneficence, without giving rise to an unduly demanding duty that requires one to always give priority to the happiness of others over one's own merely prudential ends. (The principle of impartiality contains the parenthetical remark '(especially the needs)', which might be taken to partially mitigate concerns of demandingness, however it is far from clear how a restriction to, or special concern with, needs would follow from the principle of moral equality.) Timmons and Smit indicate that they consider reasons that relate to imperfect duties to be favouring rather than requiring reasons (cf. footnote 36, also cf. footnote 20). This, however, is not satisfactory. On the one hand, the notion of superiority has no clear interpretation in the case of favouring reasons (at any rate none that would not have radically demanding implications). On the other, it is not clear how the bifurcation into favouring and requiring reasons is to be derived from the single requirement to treat humanity as an end-in-itself rather than merely as a means, especially given that humanity is to be understood as a "limiting condition" and is to be construed merely "negatively" as something against which one is not to contravene (Groundwork, 4:437, 4:436).


Thanks to Mark Timmons and Houston Smit for helpful comments.


[1] Chapters 7 ‘Perfect duties to oneself as an animal being’ and 8 ‘The moral significance of gratitude in Kant’s ethics’ (co-authored with Houston Smit) go into even more detail.

[2] A further worry is that building in too much content makes it rather difficult to explain how one can arrive at the humanity formulation on the basis of the arguments that Kant gives in Groundwork I and II, which focus on issues of universalisability and the form of maxims. (Identifying the categorical imperative in the form of the formula of humanity is distinct from establishing this imperative, which happens in Groundwork III and is set aside by Timmons and Smit since their project is internal rather than external, cf. p. 177.)