Silencing the Demon's Advocate: The Strategy of Descartes' Meditations

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Ronald Rubin, Silencing the Demon's Advocate: The Strategy of Descartes' Meditations, Stanford University Press, 2008, 187pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780804758161.

Reviewed by Jorge Secada, University of Virginia


Ronald Rubin's Silencing the Demon's Advocate interprets the Meditations on First Philosophy along traditional lines: in this fundamentally epistemological essay, Descartes offers a continuous argument directed at establishing truths with absolute certainty. Rubin's originality lies in his understanding of the nature and progress of this argument. He proposes to read the Meditations as the record of a sustained dialogue between its author and an advocate of a deceiving and most powerful demon, a confrontation constructed with the aim of silencing this representative of radical skepticism. Descartes's argument, Rubin claims, does not start from absolutely evident truths and then proceed on to further truths. Rather, it starts from an all-encompassing doubt and then goes on to limit it: in the first four meditations Descartes's "strategy … is not to add support for his beliefs … but to subtract grounds for doubt" (xiii). In Rubin's hands this general interpretative approach yields a wealth of insight into the meaning of Descartes's foundational masterpiece. Closely following the order of the Meditations, Rubin presents perceptive analyses of many of the arguments in it. He does not examine the whole of the text in detail, but concentrates on those themes which are central to his interpretation. There is, for instance, little discussion of the material falsity of ideas or of why simultaneous infinite regresses of causes are to be rejected. I will not summarize the book nor discuss most of its arguments and conclusions. Instead, I will focus on one of its central contentions and will address a decisive flaw in Rubin's interpretation.


Rubin distinguishes between doubting that p and having doubts about p, and in the latter, between having doubts which "directly challenge … p", having indirect doubts about p (i.e., doubts which undermine our reasons for believing p while being compatible with p), and having neither direct nor indirect doubts about p, but still having "meta-level … [or] metaphysical" doubts about it on account of considering the possibility that from some divine or absolute perspective our most evident beliefs are revealed to be false (4 and 19). Having doubts about p may, but need not, lead to doubting that p. As Rubin points out, in the First Meditation the reader is not invited, primarily, to doubt all her beliefs, but rather to entertain doubts about them, as a result of which she will be asked to treat them as if they were indeed false. Rubin next connects having doubts about p with being certain about it: they are opposites. Certainty, however, involves not just not having doubts; it also requires firmly holding on to p. And though these two aspects may occasionally be at odds with each other, to completely eliminate all doubts about p will stabilize belief that p: "if a person had perfect certainty concerning one of his or her beliefs, that belief would be perfectly firm and stable" (28). Rubin proposes that the meditator's quest for certainty is motivated by Descartes's desire for stability of belief.

Just having doubts about p will not always make it possible to doubt that p. Since the meditator proposes to treat all ps as false, she must adopt measures to guard against being influenced by some of her beliefs, particularly given the slight and metaphysical grounds for doubt about evident and simple ps. To ensure that she is not, Rubin argues, Descartes invents an interlocutor for the meditator who will act as the advocate of a most powerful and deceiving demon. "The Demon's Advocate … is very much like" the meditator: they both take the same beliefs to be evident and the same arguments to be valid (38). But they disagree in that while the meditator trusts her faculties, the demon's advocate believes they are deceptive, so that the former takes evident beliefs to be true and valid reasoning to be reliable and the latter does not. Descartes's method, Rubin argues, consists in confronting such an advocate and silencing him. The demon's advocate is not an irrational lunatic. He is willing to engage in rational discussion. Otherwise, it might be impossible to convince him of anything or indeed engage with him at all. But, still, he will not be persuaded by mere first-order good argument, since he has second-order doubts about the premises and inferential rules of such arguments. He will need to have those doubts dispelled, but he will not use them to make the doubts themselves immune from rational examination.

Rubin argues that the meditator can indeed convince the demon's advocate of many truths. If she fails to actually do so in the Meditations it is not because of the strategy itself, not because it is in principle impossible to do so having placed herself in a situation which "must necessarily end in a standoff", but rather because she is unable to complete "some of the tactics that it requires" (43). We can appreciate Rubin's point by looking at the case of the demon's advocate's own existence.

Rubin examines several accounts of the Cogito. He focuses on taking the Cogito to be the result of an inference from the truth that one can have grounds for doubt only if one exists, as has been recently suggested by Janet Broughton (see 51-53). Rubin grants Broughton two points: that the Cogito aims not to show that "I am" is true but rather that it is indubitable, and that "the reasoning of the Cogito should be seen as arising out of [the] method of doubt" (53). Building on these points, Rubin introduces his own "doubt-dispelling interpretation" (45). The crux of this interpretation is that the evil demon hypothesis does not provide the meditator with grounds for doubting the proposition "I am". On the contrary, the supposition that an evil demon deceives me "seems to entail that [I do] exist" (56). For Rubin, "what rescues 'I am' from doubt is … its special relation to the hypothesis … used to raise doubts" (58). So the Cogito succeeds in its aim of silencing the demon's advocate and forcing him to admit a first absolutely certain belief, a belief about which he can have no doubts whatsoever.

Rubin's analysis is instructive; it sheds light on the relation in which "I am" stands to any doubt-producing hypothesis one might entertain. It avoids some of the problems confronting other interpretations of the Cogito by ingeniously claiming that the meditator is not seeking to prove that he exists but merely that he can have no rational doubts about his existence. Nonetheless, at the start of the Third Meditation the meditator states that the hypothesis of an evil god or demon does provide her with grounds for doubt even about whether she exists. Descartes wrote this passage making explicit reference to the meditator's doubt and the fact that it entails her existence. That is, the meditator claims to have "slight and … metaphysical" grounds for doubting the following reasoning: "deceive as much as he can, he cannot make it the case that I be nothing, so long as I think I am something (fallat me quisquis potest, numquam tamen efficiet ut nihil sim, quandiu me aliqid esse cogitabo)" (AT, VII, 36). Further and most significantly, in this passage the meditator lumps together propositions such as "I am" with others like "2+3=5", failing to distinguish between them when considering the scope of the doubt. Though the syntax of the passage is complex, it leaves little room for doubt that the hypothesis of an evil god or demon is designed to cast a completely universal doubt. Unless such doubt is eliminated, one "can never be completely certain about anything else (de ulla alia plane certus esse unquam posse)". If Descartes was being hyperbolic, he had a chance to correct himself in the French translation. Instead, he allows the same point to be made again, if anything, even more clearly: without knowledge about whether there can be a deceiving god, "ie ne voy pas que ie puisse iamais estre certain d'aucune chose" (AT, IX-1, 29). There is no qualification excluding any beliefs, and given the reflection preceding this statement, there should be no question that the evil god hypothesis is intended to provide grounds for doubting even the Cogito. Rubin does not account for this passage. Instead, when discussing it he repeatedly deletes all reference to the Cogito without indicating that he is doing so (see 21 and 94-95). Perhaps Rubin believes that it is impossible to provide a coherent and satisfactory account of this text, and that it is better dismissed and ignored. Below I will briefly sketch why I would disagree.


My main issue with Rubin arises from a fundamental interpretative disagreement. I found his examination of the various Cartesian concepts and arguments enlightening even when I thought he was wrong. But I also found that his essay failed to capture the most basic point and the structure of the Meditations. To bring this out, let us ask ourselves: who is the I of the Meditations? Rubin's answer is straightforward and perhaps the first to come to mind: the I is Descartes himself, the author of those sentences in the first-person. Though he never raises this question explicitly, that this is his answer is apparent throughout the text. Early on, he writes that in the First Meditation "Descartes … demonstrates that he has grounds for doubts" and immediately after substitutes "he" (referring to Descartes) where the text has "I" (xii-xiii; see also, e.g., 31). Introducing the figure of the demon's advocate, Rubin writes that "having imagined this person, [Descartes] pretends to be him … . When this other person speaks in the Meditations, it is of course through Descartes and in the first person" (38). Later on, he describes the work as having a "method [which] involves Descartes' playing the role of a … Demon's Advocate …" (44). Finally, he writes that in "the Meditations, Descartes says that … he has arranged -- temporarily one might suppose -- for the seclusion that the project will require" (170). Having assumed that the I of the Meditations is Descartes himself, a further question immediately arises: why write in the first-person? This question acquires some urgency given a widely shared assumption, which Rubin appears to adopt without qualms: that the Meditations is a philosophical essay presenting a continuous argument designed to support various doctrines and theses. One usually does not present arguments and proofs in the first person. A common suggestion, which once more Rubin seems to follow, is that with this stylistic device Descartes "urges his readers" to imitate him and make his arguments their own (23).

This reading of the Meditations is fundamentally mistaken. Interestingly, when addressing the demonstrations of God's existence, Rubin writes that "[i]n Descartes' time, meditations (of roughly the same form as his Meditations) were used to record religious conversion. In his own way, Descartes uses the literary form for the same purpose" (99; see also 104-105). Conversion involves coming "to affirm that God exists". In this case, it comes about through "consideration of an argument … . Reason … is the tool of conversion". There is some truth in this, and perhaps even more than just a grain, but it is also decidedly off target. To describe a Renaissance or Early Modern meditation as a "record [of a] religious conversion" or as a report of a project "whose aim is the attainment of perfect certainty" is curiously detached and anachronistic (44). Meditations were not reports of conversions; they were manuals for spiritual healing and renewal. Descartes's Meditations, like other works of its genre, was designed to bring about a transformative process in the reader: it is an instrument for cognitive therapy. Far from being the author himself, the meditator is Descartes's patient, who must follow the meditational course of treatment once in her lifetime in order to be able to securely grasp the true nature of things and the foundations of science.

The unity and coherence of the Meditations is not exclusively that of rational argument. The Cartesian Meditations is instead a course of treatment for a cognitive illness or deficiency inherent to human beings, resulting from the embodiment of the human mind, which is consequently subject to passions, feelings and emotions and must rely on sensation and imagination to know the world around it. Descartes hoped that readers of his meditations would actually be meditators living through the meditational process. The Meditations does not describe this undertaking; rather, it aims to become the expression of the reader's own transformation. She will have to struggle to overcome "the habit of holding on to old opinions" and form new cognitive dispositions (AT, VII, 34; see AT, VII, 162-163). From Descartes's point of view, the intended reader and the meditational ego are living through the same salutary process. Yet, we, contemporary readers, can no longer oblige its author; we cannot be transported to the XVIIth century and fully engage in that curative meditation. 21st century readers cannot take on the meditator's garb because we can no longer believe Descartes's promises nor take seriously his diagnosis. If nothing else, we know too much which Descartes ignored. So we must distinguish between author, meditational character, and reader, keeping in mind that the distinction between the latter two was not originally intended but results from historical distance.

The order of the Meditations, then, is not dictated purely by the requirements of rational argument. Though Descartes will use good argument as a tool in this work, he will also have the meditator entertain arguments which will be discarded as unsatisfactory once they have served their purpose. This is the case with the various skeptical hypotheses introduced in the First Meditation. But not all skeptical arguments are on a par: for instance, the supposition that all waking life is like a dream contains significant truth, since all sensation involves materially false ideas (contrast 10 and 166-168).

Let us, however, focus on the most radical skepticism the meditator comes upon in the First Meditation. She asks herself whether there may not be an evil god, or a lesser but still most powerful malignant demon, who makes her "go wrong every time I add two and three or count the sides of a square, or in some even simpler matter, if that is imaginable" (AT, VII, 21). Since some commentators have had trouble grasping the scope of the proposed doubt, we should remind ourselves of it by recalling the text at the start of the Third Meditation which I cited earlier. The hypothesis is explicitly stated to cast doubt on the mediator's knowledge of the following propositions: I am something so long as I think I am something; if I exist now it will be true at a later time that in the past I existed; and 2+3=5 (see AT, VII, 36). Now, once "the weight of preconceived opinion is counter-balanced and the distorting influence of habit" is overcome by persisting in the skeptical stance, the meditator will have to reconsider this skeptical argument (AT, VII, 22). She will then discover that the hypothesis of a successful omnideceptive demon is incoherent. So the skeptical arguments of which it is part can be dismissed. But the meditator does not start considering this until the Third Meditation. The Second Meditation appears to completely forget the skeptical argument about reason, while keeping alive the skeptical arguments about the senses. Already in the First Meditation there is an asymmetry between radical skepticism regarding reason and skepticism regarding the senses: only the latter is mentioned by the meditator as she closes that day's reflections and proposes to think not that a square has more or less than four sides or that two and three are not five but only "that … all external things are merely the delusions of dreams which [some malicious demon] has devised to ensnare my judgment" and that she has no body (AT, VII, 22-23). Even when first introduced, doubt about simple truths of reason seems to be tentative and, unlike doubts about the senses, not to be fully taken on board by the meditator (see AT, VII, 21). Why?

As Rubin stresses, when the most evident and simple truths of reason are present to it, the mind is compelled to assent. So doubts regarding them can only be entertained obliquely, while not considering them. The meditator does not take that skeptical stance in the Second Meditation because at that stage of the therapy the point is for her to isolate and exercise pure intellectual perception. This is the context of her asking "what shall I now say that I am, when I am supposing there is some supremely powerful and … malicious deceiver" and later "[a]re not these things [that I doubt, understand, affirm, deny, desire, will, imagine, and sense] just as true as the fact that I exist, even if I am asleep at the time, and even if he who created me is doing all he can to deceive me?" (AT, VII, 26 and 28-29). During the Second Meditation the meditator focuses on doubt regarding the senses and imagination; to bring to mind then that "it would be easy" for God to have "given [her] a nature such that [she] was deceived even in matters which seemed most evident" and whose denial contains "an obvious contradiction" would be counterproductive (AT, VII, 36).

But why then bring up skeptical considerations about reason at all? Partly to strengthen doubts regarding preconceived opinion and the senses, but more importantly to motivate an inquiry that will result in the self-validation of reason. In order to engage in the latter the meditator must already have gotten hold of her intellectual powers. This is a position in which she finds herself at the start of the Third Meditation, not before: "I will now shut my eyes, stop my ears, and withdraw all my senses" (AT, VII, 34). The Second Meditation is designed to put the meditator in just that state where she isolates clear and distinct intellectual perception and separates it from sensation and imagination: "in order to understand metaphysical matters the mind must be drawn away from the senses … . The correct, and … unique, method of achieving this is contained in my Second Meditation" (AT, VII, 131).

It is only then that consideration of the skeptical hypothesis regarding reason can properly begin, in the following meditation. At that point, the start of the Third Meditation, the meditator has formulated a rule of truth: what is clearly and distinctly perceived is true. In the Second Meditation she discovered that it is the intellect alone in clear and distinct perception which delivers propositions that appear to be immune to all but the most extreme doubt; and, again, that it is clear and distinct intellectual perception alone which grounds her capacity to apprehend even the things she tends to believe, perhaps falsely, exist around her. In a sense, she has found out how to assess good arguments. However, a skeptical argument has been advanced to the effect that reason and its clear and distinct intellectual perceptions cannot be trusted. She cannot lay claim to know with complete security even those simple and most evident matters: "if I do not know [whether there is a God, and, if there is, whether he can be a deceiver], it is apparent that I can never be quite certain about anything else" (AT, VII, 36). She is in the position of the atheist who "clearly apprehends (clare cognoscere)" some relatively simple geometrical matter, but who lacks "true science (veram scientiam)" since "no cognition which can be rendered doubtful is fit to be called science (nulla cognitio, quae dubia reddi potest, videtur scientia appellanda)" (AT, VII, 141). Further, even if the skeptic is wrong, the meditator has no reason to trust reason. She is convinced of the simple and evident truths she clearly and distinctly perceives. But is this conviction grounded? It appears that, at the start of the Third Meditation, the meditator has no grounds for it: even if the skeptical argument is assumed invalid or unsound, that on its own provides no reason to trust reason, though it of course eliminates a reason not to trust it. These two issues, the refutation of the radical skeptic and the validation of reason, should not be conflated.

We are now ready to dissolve an intractable knot of problems facing many commentators, and which we have seen also confronts Rubin. If the doubt is truly universal in scope, how can the meditator ever hope to refute it? And if it is not, how to restrict its scope in a principled manner and explain a text which claims it is? In particular, can the Cogito escape an absolutely universal doubt? And if it cannot, what is the point of bringing it up in the Second Meditation? Finally, the meditator appears to validate reason, but this validation relies on reason, so it seems to be viciously circular.

The solution is relatively simple. The Cogito does not refute the skeptic, nor does it escape the scope of the most extreme skeptical doubt. It is part of a necessary parenthesis before the radical skeptical hypothesis proposed in the First Meditation can be examined. Rubin is right when he follows most commentators in requiring the skeptic to be "rational" and to rely on "acceptable argument": the skeptical hypothesis must be coherent and the skeptic must be "reasonable" (40 and 37). He is also correct that, in order to give the skeptic his fair day in court, the skeptical argument is granted immunity from refutation merely on account of its entailing, by design, that contradictions are true and evident and simple propositions false (see 20-21). But Rubin fails to appreciate that the point the meditator will make against the skeptic is just that per se the malignant god or demon hypothesis is not coherent. That is the end of the story as far as that skeptical argument regarding reason is concerned; the skeptic has offered no grounds for doubting clear and distinct truths. Rubin is wrong when he implies that "the hypotheses that Descartes used" in the First Meditation fail to "provide us with grounds for doubt concerning [the proposition 'I am']" but do give grounds for doubting "[t]he square has four sides" (58). The claim that we may be wrong about the square having four sides on account of the possibility that there be a deceiving demon is no better off than the mere assertion that a square has fifteen sides since that hypothesis is incoherent and it is impossible that a successful omnideceiver exist. So the only interpretative issues here are why this realization comes in the Third Meditation and not before. Why raise the doubts in the first place and why interpose the Second Meditation? We have already seen how to answer those questions.

If one grants the malignant demon hypothesis and the associated skeptical argument, if one treats its conclusion -- that I go wrong about the simplest matters -- as if it were known to be true, then all conversation stops. That is, if reason cannot be trusted and obvious contradictions and absurdities may be true, then I cannot make any points or conduct any inquiry. In particular, I cannot then argue that "an argument with inconsistent premises is unsound" (55). Granted, the skeptic must be rational and provide good arguments for his doubts. But we cannot grant his radical argument, treat it as if it were sound and true, and then continue a rational discussion.

Rubin attempts to show that the Cogito is unique in escaping radical skepticism. But he faces a problem similar to that which confronts other commentators. Here is his account of how "I am" is privileged. To infer from the malignant demon's hypothesis that "I am" might be false, I must rely on premises like "[m]y mind is so poorly designed that what seems obviously true to me is in fact false" which entail that I exist (54). "And such premises can validly entail that [I do not exist] only if those premises are inconsistent. But … an unsound argument does not provide us with reason for accepting its conclusion" (55). However, as we have noted above, if the skeptic's argument against reason is granted, then he can argue that for all we know reasoning with inconsistent premises is sound and does support its conclusion. So Rubin should perhaps be read as claiming that even if we concede the cogency of the hypothesis of a successful omnideceiving demon, the skeptical argument would fail to provide grounds for doubts about "I am" while it may generate doubts about other evident propositions. But how is he to stop those doubts from infecting the Cogito? Suppose the meditator has doubts about ~(if p, then ~p) and considers that perhaps if p, then ~p. She could then argue back against Rubin thus: but perhaps if I am, then I am not, and you just made me claim that I am, so perhaps I am not. If the evil demon is successful, then for all I know it may be that I am deceived when I do not exist, just as it may be that p is both true and false at the same time. That is what the meditator says at the start of the Third Meditation. So she will argue against Rubin that if she is allowed "to treat … the hypothesis of the evil demon as true", then that it can provide her with grounds for doubting that she exists only insofar as it implies that she does exist need not dispel her doubts about whether she exists (175, note 7). The real issue is whether the hypothesis should be granted. When it is determined that it should not, all clear and distinct truths are rescued from that argument, not just "I am". And this, again, is what the meditator actually says at the start of the Third Meditation.

Following on Broughton's footsteps, Rubin leans on the claim that the radical skeptical argument entails that the meditator exists while it does not entail that "the square has four sides". This is what allows him to argue that it provides no grounds for doubting the meditator's own existence while it does provide grounds for doubting arithmetical propositions (and, I would add, the simplest and most evident logical truths). But is "I am" unique in this way? This is at best unclear, raising complex issues which remind us of Carroll's turtle and bring to mind questions about the nature of entailment, presupposition and the relation between sound argument and logical truths. We need not address them here nor are they discussed by Rubin. (Note, by the way, that the skeptic is granted immunity from refutation on account of his argument entailing by design that p & ~p, but not from its entailing, and not by design, both that p & ~ p and ~(p & ~p), if it were to entail the latter. We should also note that there is an asymmetry here: "I am" is not a necessary truth.) Even if Rubin were right, he would still need to demonstrate the immunity of "I am" to doubts about propositions of the form a=a, ~(p & ~p), and the like; and he would have to acknowledge that the evil demon hypothesis, another premise of the skeptic's argument, one not particularly related to "I am", is also incoherent (or so the meditator will claim).

Why has this straightforward point been lost on commentators? I propose that this is due to the interposition of the Second Meditation, and the Cogito within it. Commentators fail to see, that is, that the Second Meditation is a methodological parenthesis in the argument with the skeptic, required to prepare the meditator to consider the malignant demon argument of the First Meditation. More generally, what has blinded commentators is a failure, glaring in Rubin's case, to appreciate the meditational and therapeutic nature of the Meditations; that, and the fact that most commentators rightly find the demonstration of the incoherence of the radical skeptical hypothesis to be wanting. My only comment to this last point is that one should be as demanding with the skeptical hypothesis and its supposed entailments regarding the possible falsity of simple truths of reason, as one is with its supposed refutation. I myself find neither convincing; I fail to grasp how "it would be easy" for God to make me go wrong about "manifest contradiction[s]" (AT, VII, 36). None of this of course denies the philosophical interest of inquiring into the logic of skeptical hypothesis, and into the relations between propositions like I am or if p, then ~~p and skeptical arguments about reason. It may be, finally, that what has led commentators astray here is the intrinsic interest of these other matters.

Be that as it may, disposing of the radical skeptical hypothesis is not enough to validate reason. What that would require is a demonstration that reason is trustworthy. Would such demonstration, a good argument to the effect that good arguments are to be trusted, be circular? In some sense, evidently yes. But would it be viciously so? Would it, that is, be worthless? I do not think so. Contrary to Hume's suggestion, Descartes never promised the impossible feat of validating reason by appeal to something other than rational argument (see the first Enquiry, XII, 1). If someone doubts the value of a rational validation of reason, such as we find at the end of the Fifth Meditation, then he should consider the space of logical possibility here: that there be good arguments both for and against the trustworthiness of reason; that there be no good arguments either way; that there be a good argument against trusting reason; and that there be good argument only for the trustworthiness of reason (see AT, VII, 68-71). Evidently, there is a best outcome here. (Compare with Rubin's rather forced discussion in 132-135.)

Consequences of Rubin's fundamental misunderstanding of the character of the Meditations are apparent throughout his essay. I will not go over them, but will instead finish by reiterating that in spite of what I take to be a major shortcoming, Rubin's ingenious, elegant, and terse essay is a most valuable contribution to the Cartesian secondary literature, containing a wealth of insight into the nature and structure of Descartes's metaphysical doctrines and arguments. Silencing the Demon's Advocate will surely be an obligatory reference for anyone seeking to understand Descartes's philosophy.