Simone Weil: Attention to the Real

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Robert Chenavier, Simone Weil: Attention to the Real, Bernard E. Doering (tr.), University of Notre Dame Press, 2012, 128pp., $20.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780268023737.

Reviewed by Mark Shiffman, Villanova University


Robert Chenavier's comprehensive and judicious précis of Simone Weil's thought is the fruit of years as a student and editor of Weil's oeuvre, as president of the French Weil Society and editor of the journal devoted entirely to her thought. A testimony to the very loving attention that is its theme, Attention to the Real is, by the same token, an almost entirely uncritical intellectual and spiritual hagiography -- but one that is sufficiently lucid to provide the critical reader with the outlines of Weil's thought required for fruitful engagement.

The introduction identifies and situates Weil's central philosophical objective: "to reduce the opposition between a Plato whose theory of knowledge would have integrated the domain of work and a Marx who would have developed the most precious elements of his materialism by preserving the reality of the supernatural." For Weil, work, as an engagement of the body and soul with the necessities and limits of matter, plays a crucial role in bringing us to a truthful encounter with the real. It is one dimension of an orientation toward encountering the real on all its levels, including that which surpasses our grasp while it draws us to itself: the supernatural. This sketch provides the itinerary for the subsequent chapters: (1) an overview of Weil's life, emphasizing her engagements with reality on its different levels; (2) an examination of her early philosophical studies and efforts to assess the real possibilities for labor reform; (3) the terms of Weil's attempt to surpass Marxist thought "from within"; (4) Weil's religious awakening and its consequences for her understanding of the ultimate reality that must be the reference point of a genuine humanism; (5) the various paths by which we must open our lives to this ultimate reality.

Weil's early engagement with the labor movement and socialist groups impels her in 1932 (at the age of 23) to travel to Germany to see for herself what the realities on the ground presage for the dreams of a workers' revolution. The vitriolic reaction of French socialists to her sober and pessimistic assessment, and subsequently to her honest, lucid critique of the Soviet government, reveals how determined the leaders of the labor movement are to remain wrapped in illusion. To gain the clarity they lack about the real challenges to reform, she goes to work in a factory, where she learns that the very character of the labor demanded is dehumanizing and deadening.

While recovering from this brutal experience, she encounters beautiful celebrations of Christian devotion that speak to her soul of the truth of the human condition: subjection to the crushing violence of necessity, and a yearning for pure goodness which opens the soul to contact with transformative grace. During the two years it takes her to remove her parents from occupied Paris to New York via Marseilles, she discusses the mysteries of Catholicism with a Dominican priest, aids his order in their clandestine resistance activities, works at farm labor, practices prayer, and writes extensively on the Greeks, Christianity, and their affinities. She spends her final nine months working for Free France in London, where she writes her late works on social theory in the light of the human longing for the transcendent Good, then dies in a sanatorium of tuberculosis, starvation and anguish.

Chapter two takes us back to Weil's initial philosophical labors. Thinking through the problem of knowledge in Descartes leads her to grasp that, if philosophy is to surpass the pure imagination of Cartesian idealism, it must do so along the direction of a work-centered phenomenology, and this must in turn guide the institutionalization of humanizing work. Weil's factory experience further shows her that the very pursuit of efficiency by which Marx hoped to increase productive forces leads only to greater dehumanization of the worker, reduced to "the docility of a resigned beast of burden" and prevented from attaining the vision of free and intelligent agency that must animate any fruitful revolutionary program. Thus her task changes from revolution to reform, guided by the question: under what conditions of factory production can work embody a humanizing encounter with the real?

At the beginning of the trajectory, we can see how Weil's Platonism starts out as "the Platonism of Descartes and Kant," a starting point that remains always determinative for her. Her early "redrafting of the divided line" culminates in the Cartesian hyperbolic doubt, about which there is something deeply un-Socratic -- for, while Socratic questioning leaves nothing immune to doubt, it never attempts to cast "everything" into doubt as a whole. As helpful as Chenavier's dialectic between Platonic transcendence and Marxist materialism may be for structuring the story of her thought, it must also be borne in mind that at a deeper and often hidden level she is always implicitly struggling both within and against the fundamentally Gnostic stance that modern Idealism takes toward the world as such.

The brief third chapter brings to a head Weil's critique of Marxist materialism and the outline of her way forward. She rightly notes a confusion in Marx's transposition of Hegel. Hegelian dialectical history sees Spirit at work in the world, progressively realizing its fulfillment. Marx grounds the historical process in materialist necessity operative in the ordering of social relations, but nonetheless smuggles into the operation of this material process a directedness toward justice and freedom, aspirations of the human spirit. For Weil, this contradiction, rather than invalidating Marx's thought, serves as a signpost to a truer conception: "Man having as his very essence the effort toward the good is at the same time subject . . . to a necessity absolutely indifferent to the good."

Weil's correction relies on a transposition of the Kantian dualism of necessity (physics) and freedom (moral law). Her notion of "matter" expands to include the notional substratum of whatever operates according to inflexible necessity, whether stones, plants, states in their pursuit of power, or the psyche in its self-aggrandizing self-deceptions. All this she groups under the heading "gravity". Its complement is the longing for absolute good, and the consent that this good should enter the soul and liberate it from the effects of gravitational necessity. This is grace, or the action of the supernatural. Only the coldest cynically lucid analysis of the scope and operations of gravity -- the most uncompromising "materialism" -- provides the basis for specifying "the conditions under which the supernatural operation of an infinitely small quantity of pure good, when properly placed, can neutralize this heaviness."

With this lucid and decisive formulation of the dualism of gravity and grace, Weil arrives at her mature vision, which is forthrightly Gnostic: the world is characterized by pitiless force with which the aspirations of the spirit are in profound contradiction. Her position appears to be an unstable middle between the Gnosticism of the moderns, in which the aspiration is to control and transform the world to the will's specifications, and that of the ancients, in which the aspiration is liberation from the bonds of the world-prison. She can occupy this middle position because she understands the world, as a whole system, to be precisely designed by love to point our spirit beyond itself (the topic of chapter five). On the other hand, doctrines of the Catholic Church to which she is attracted (Incarnation, Resurrection and Eucharist) challenge the stability of this position (chapter four).

Chenavier calls chapter four "Philosophy and Spirituality," and makes its centerpiece the section on "The Philosophical Cleansing of the Catholic Religion." This latter expression is Weil's, and she insisted that this task could only be undertaken by someone "both inside and outside the Church," precisely the position she conceived herself to be in during her final years. Chenavier emphasizes the view from outside more than the allure of the inside. What Weil characterizes as a mystical encounter with Christ leads her to see that her aspirations toward pure good amount to implicit forms of faith and love. The hunger is real, and there is no reason to suppose that it has no real object. True to both her methodological conscience and her Platonic inspiration, she emphasizes the path of negative theology: the atheist, critical of all pretensions of false idols, is often closer to genuine faith than the "believer".

The epistemological pre-condition for thinking truthfully about God is the spiritual condition of receptivity to grace; this requires purgation of the self, bound as it is to the psychic necessities of self-assertion of its power and self-defense of its cherished finite attachments. While she encountered this spiritual path through Christianity, Weil saw it present under other forms in other religions, provided one is able, through loving attention, to transport oneself to their center. Weil thus attempts to maintain both that Christianity is not simply the one true faith, but at the same time that the Incarnation and Crucifixion reveal most fully what God is and what the human response to this reality demands: total abandon to love, to the point of accepting self-annihilation.

It is only possible to evade Weil's incoherence on the incomparable hermeneutical primacy of the Crucifixion if one sticks entirely with the "outside" position, which did seem to dominate her thinking, though apparently not her longing for Eucharistic communion. By her lights (at least in the Marseilles period), Christianity is the offspring of earlier mystery religions, whose thought is most perfectly expressed in Plato, and to which only the Gnostics, Manichees and Cathars remained entirely faithful. She either never encountered or never assimilated the cogent arguments with which the Church repeatedly rejected this form of heresy in its recurrent guises.

Chenavier, however, adds to the incoherence by insisting that for Weil it is "precisely in their otherness that the elements of truth and goodness which structure the other religions must be recognized." Whether or not this represents what Weil thought she was doing, it does not seem to be what she did (except perhaps in the case of the Baghavad-Gita). She consistently gathered up whatever she found to be consistent with her abstract Gnosticism and its dissolution of all particularity. Thus Chenavier falsely characterizes her uncompromising rejection of the God of Israel as a "distortion in Weil's method." Weil distinguished between true religions of self-annihilating love and idolatrous religions of power (which she found in Islam, Rome and Hitlerism as much as in the Old Testament). There is no more place in her Gnostic schema for a religion of covenant than for a resurrection of the body.

The final chapter outlines the paths by which Weil thought we could attain self-surrender in obedience to the appeal of supernatural love. The path foregrounded is that of "decreation," Weil's term for the self-annihilating imitation of Christ in which we cede back to God the freedom granted us to separate ourselves from the action of grace. The most perfect imitation is the way of affliction, which for Weil "implies simultaneously the three experiences of brutal violence, of hopeless distress and of humiliating social degradation." There is also attention (the "negative effort" of clearing oneself out of the path of receiving the true perception of reality), as well as the love of beauty (understood in Weil's transposed Kantian terms as inclining us toward "a non-representable end" and thus "a presence that is a supreme absence").

In addition to decreation, we can attain, through work rightly conceived, an experience of obedience to necessity that opens onto knowledge of the supernatural. Here Weil alters her original program of socialist humanism (to "return to man, that is to say to the individual, the domination that is his proper function to exercise over nature, over tools, over society itself") by acknowledging that the modern project of controlling nature forgets obedience, "believing that this disenchanted world is subject to our exaggerated power." Finally, there is the possibility of recognizing, in our social relations, the connection we share in our essence as beings longing for transcendent Good. This is achieved through recognition of our obligation (which must be embodied in appropriate laws and institutions) to respect the fundamental needs of body and soul, as detailed in the social theory of Weil's last writings. This duty, grounded in transcendent dignity, precedes and grounds rights; otherwise they are inescapably embedded within and limited by a discourse of power.

With these "Christian Platonist" paths to the supernatural, Weil takes a step firmly out the door of modern thought in a genuinely Platonic direction by affirming the Good beyond being. But for the Platonic tradition (and especially Christian Platonism), the Good is always responsible for and manifested in the distinct being of each being, while for Weil it is only manifested here below in the created whole as a whole. In this sense her Cartesian starting point, positioning the spirit from the outset in a Gnostic estrangement from being as a whole, holds her back from Plato, toward whom she is nevertheless always moving. Chenavier does a marvelous job transporting the reader to the inside of this trajectory, a vantage point from which we cannot but admire Weil's relentless insistence on integrity of life and thought. Perhaps this can help us as well to sympathize with her failures, in her all-too-brief life, to fully attain the clarity she sought.

I have focused on the merits and limitations of Chenavier's study, and not on the English translation of Chenavier's French text. The deficiencies of this translation, unfortunately, are legion: one could fill pages with a catalogue of the dropped or mistranslated words and false cognates, and the author's sensitively worded distinctions construed contrary to their sense. I will limit myself to the handling of the crucial term "malheur." In translations of Weil's work this is usually rendered "affliction," and is her term for that most revealing encounter with reality that served as a fundamental turning point in her understanding of the human condition. We find it by turns translated as "hardship", "misfortune", "suffering", and "misery" -- this last in the very passage in which Chenavier quotes Weil's initial "definition" of the term immediately resulting from her factory experience. Nothing in the contexts demands these variations, and such inattentiveness unfortunately undoes the masterful orchestration Chenavier deploys to unfold his account of Weil's thought with such admirable succinctness.