Singular Thought and Mental Files

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Rachel Goodman, James Genone, and Nick Kroll (eds.), Singular Thought and Mental Files, Oxford University Press, 2020, 268pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198746881.

Reviewed by Michele Palmira, Complutense University of Madrid


Upon attending perceptually to a chair in front of me I think a thought I would express by saying: 'That is blue'. Philosophers of mind have dubbed this kind of thought singular. What's the nature of singular thought? What's its distribution? These questions have struck many as philosophically deep. Yet, they also carry an aura of obscurity inherited from the very notion of singularity. The notion of mental file -- on account of its alleged precise definability and empirically certified pedigree -- holds the potential to free us from that obscurity while, at the same time, preserving philosophical depth. Mental files are mental representations whose main function is to enable the collection and storage of information about the particular object they refer to. The files' reference is not determined via the information stored into the file: this makes mental files nondescriptive modes of presentation, or singular concepts, of an object.

The foregoing explains why this volume -- the first collection of essays that attempts to systematically probe the significance of the file-theoretic framework for questions about singular thought -- should be more than welcomed by anyone interested in debates about concepts, content, reference, attitude reports, acquaintance, and many others.

The volume is divided into four parts. As is perhaps inevitable in an ambitious collection, not all the contributions fit neatly within the advertised topical organisation. The reader in search of criticisms of the file-theoretic approach to singular thought should read the chapters by Mark Sainsbury, Marga Reimer, and Jeffrey C. King, and the chapter by Michael Murez, Joulia Smortchkova, and Brent Strickland. Part III contains -- with the notable exception of an appendix to chapter 11 (by Imogen Dickie) -- alternatives to, and not criticisms of, the file framework. Let me also note that John Perry's contribution and Ruth Millikan's are summaries of their respective views which have already received extensive scrutiny in the literature. Given the space allotted and in the interest of discussing new material, I've decided not to comment on them.

The volume's introduction, by Rachel Goodman and James Genone, is admirably clear. I recommend it to anyone who wishes to become familiar with the history, motivation, substance, and deadlocks of the persistent debate on singular thought. I also applaud Goodman and Genone's positive, albeit tentative, suggestion of unifying the apparently gerrymandered category of singular thought by looking at certain "formal, cognitive, or functional features [of] paradigmatic cases of singular thought such as referentially successful perceptual-demonstrative thoughts" (p. 7).[1]

Sainsbury's "Varieties of Singularity" and Reimer's "Descriptive Names and Singular Thought: Reflections on the Evans/Kaplan Debate" cohesively raise the issue whether debates about singular thought are substantive, favouring a negative answer to that question. Along the way, each criticises François Recanati's epistemic version of a file-theoretic story about singular thought.

Sainsbury singles out seven marks or properties of singularity and then argues that "for any two properties, there are cases which come out as singular according to one but not according to the other" (p. 23). Sainsbury's discussion of the various marks of singularity is illuminating. However, the chapter takes a somewhat unexpected turn when he focuses on one such mark -- what he calls object-involving truth conditions. Sainsbury tells us that "there is an interesting connection between non-empty name-like-syntax singular thoughts and object-involving ones" (p. 32) and gives an account of that connection in familiar semantic instrumentalist terms. The reader is left to wonder, however, whether, and if so why, that connection is so interesting that it deserves the spotlight in the study of singular thought. There certainly is room for substantive debate about that.

Reimer offers a conciliatory resolution of the dispute between Gareth Evans and David Kaplan on descriptively introduced names and their power to generate new singular thoughts about their denotations. The received view is that the Evans-Kaplan dispute is substantive. But Reimer contends that while Evans's aim was to argue that our semantic ability to introduce and use new names into the language and our epistemological capacity to understand and believe singular mental states come apart, Kaplan was mainly concerned with showing that introducing new devices of direct reference ensures the expressibility of new singular semantic contents. To use Reimer's slogan, singular semantic contents can be "expressible without thereby being 'impressible'" (p. 39). I agree with Reimer that the notions of singular thought and singular content must be kept distinct, but this does not yet rule that questions about the order of explanation between semantic contents and mental vehicles are merely verbal. Should we explain the mental phenomenon of singular thought in terms of the semantic notion of singular proposition? Philosophers such as King and John Hawthorne and David Manley go for a positive answer to this question, but others disagree and even maintain that the order of explanation should in fact be reversed.[2]

Jeff Speaks's "Content and the Explanatory Role of Experience" concludes Part I. Speaks examines three prominent arguments in favour of nonconceptualism about the contents of experience and finds all of them wanting. This is one of the best pieces on the topic that I've read in some time, but I should note that the connection with the collection's titular topics is left almost completely unexplored.

Part II ("The Mental Files Conception of Singular Thought") begins with King's "Singular Thought, Russellianism, and Mental Files". King presents us with an instance of what we may dub content inflationism, a kind of approach that seeks to explain mental phenomena in terms of features of the semantic contents we ascribe to the representational vehicles that give rise to the target explananda. He then engages critically with Jeshion's and Recanati's (2012) file-theoretic treatments of singular thought. I focus here on King's positive proposal only. The version of the inflationary approach King develops comes with an assumption and a methodology: the assumption is that to have a singular thought is to think a Russellian singular proposition. The methodology consists in establishing the nature of singular thoughts on the grounds of our intuitive judgements about the truth-values of de re ascriptions, whose truth (in a context) requires that the ascriber have an attitude towards a singular proposition. While assuming the existence of singular propositions conceived à la Russell is highly controversial[3] -- something which should make us wary of the ultimate tenability of the project pursued in the chapter -- I should like to emphasise that King executes the project insightfully. He articulates a pragmatic picture to the effect that the singularity of our thoughts can vary across contexts since we can make most de re ascriptions false by changing the context. I've said "most" since King himself acknowledges that cases of referentially successful perceptual-demonstrative singular thoughts are such that we can't make the corresponding de re ascriptions false by simply changing the context. King ventures the hypothesis of using the label "singular thought" for those cases only, but that strikes me as a radical departure from and not a mere alternative version of the Russellian-pragmatic approach. So, one can reasonably wonder whether we'd better turn back to an epistemological (see Dickie, this volume) or cognitive (see Goodman and Genone, this volume) theory of what makes referentially successful perceptual-demonstrative singular thoughts so special.

Murez, Smortchkova, and Strickland's "The Mental Files Theory of Singular Thought: A Psychological Perspective" rectifies an important gap in the literature by delving into the often-voiced but under-examined contention that a file-theoretic approach to singular thought helps us make real progress with the nature of the latter in virtue of the empirical respectability of the former (see Jeshion and Recanati 2012). Their chapter has the great virtue of combining a competent and armchair philosopher-friendly presentation of the empirical data with a subtle discussion of how such data should be brought to bear on the philosophical project of understanding singular thought in file-theoretic terms. Murez, Smortchkova, and Strickland argue that Jeshion's and Recanati's claim that mental files can be modelled after object-files -- mid-level visual representations posited by psychologists to account for a number of empirically tested visual effects -- only holds for a very limited range of cases. Murez, Smortchkova, and Strickland are cautiously optimistic about extending the files' referential range horizontally, as they muster evidence in favour of other types of mid-level visual representations beyond object-files. This would deliver an account of perceptual-demonstrative thoughts.

As for other kinds of thoughts, e.g., memory/communication-based thoughts, they consider empirical evidence for the existence of object-files-like representations beyond perception, sifting through a vertical extension of files. The jury is still out on the vertical strategy, but I worry that, even if successful, the strategy won't deliver everything some mental file theorists might want. On Recanati's influential theory (2012), mental files enable a subject to gain and store information about an object in virtue of having epistemically rewarding relations to it. Now, if part of the vertical extension strategy rests on the idea that files have evolved to play other non-epistemic functions, (Recanati 2013), and if the mental file theorist can account for memory/communication-based thoughts only via vertical extension, it follows that the mental files we token in all such cases do not perform the epistemic function of storing information about objects via epistemically rewarding relations to them. This outcome would frustrate the epistemological aspirations of Recanati's file framework.

Mental files promise to offer a strikingly simple explanation of the phenomenon of de jure coreference in language and thought. If I say "Alice is running late. She's still at the pub", the terms "Alice" and "she" corefer to Alice in such a way that no one who understands the discourse can reasonably deny that fact. Upon listening to the utterances, I can trade on identity (Campbell) and infer that someone is both late and at the pub. The driving thought of mental file theorists is that de jure coreference between two terms 'A' and 'B' is explained by the fact the same mental file is associated with them.

In "Coreference De Jure", Recanati takes up two important challenges to the file-theoretic explanation of de jure coreference. The first has to do with apparent counterexamples to the epistemic transparency of de jure coreference relations, the second has to do with cases of intransitive de jure coreference. which would jeopardise the same-file explanation due to the transitivity of identity.

Recanati's solution to both problems rests on a central insight: de jure coreference comes in two distinct varieties, a strong one and a weak one. Strong de jure coreference conditionalises on the actual reference of one of the two terms, whereas weak de jure coreference conditionalises on the actual reference of both terms. Recanati carefully articulates this proposal by discussing a number of interesting examples. The outcome is that weak de jure coreference relations are transparent and intransitive; in diachronic cases, such relations hold between file-stages and not between files themselves. He gestures at the possibility of retrieving strong de jure coreference in all problematic cases by focusing on a specific agential or temporal point of view. I wonder whether this should lead us to admit yet another variety of (relativised) de jure coreference. This said, the pluralist proposal devised by Recanati comes with a number of commitments, and readers should pause to think whether they're willing to undertake them. For one thing, we should accept the existence of both files and file-stages and it's unclear whether, and how, that can be empirically sustained. Following Dickie (this volume), one might also ask: Why not dispense with files and file-stages altogether and explain everything at the level of "the process of maintaining a body of beliefs treated as about a single thing" (p. 249)? For another, as also emphasised by Ángel Pinillos, the file theorist is committed to excluding the possibility of dynamic trading on identity inferences, e.g., cases in which one concludes that something that was F is now G by trading on the identity of two token representations of an object that constitute distinct ways of thinking about the object. As I see it, this is a matter we'd best remain neutral on.

Pinillos's "De Jure Anti-Coreference and Mental Files" commendably draws our attention to the as-of-yet neglected notion of de jure anti-coreference, which he defines as follows: "if representation occurrences a and b are de jure anti-coreferential in a discourse, then if an agent understands the discourse, they know that a and b refer to distinct objects if they refer at all" (p. 191). Pinillos correctly notes that while de jure coreference is very common, de jure anti-coreference is not. Mental file theorists -- or Fregeans in general -- have a readily available explanation of this asymmetry that is grounded on the idea that while in de jure coreference the same file (or sense) is deployed twice, in de jure anti-coreference multiple files are deployed. Pinillos claims that the file-based explanation of the asymmetry is hampered by the possibility of cases of dynamic of de jure coreference. As has already emerged previously, this is a deep point of disagreement with Recanati. In Pinillos's view such cases require positing a semantically non-reducible relation he dubs transparency of source that holds between tokens of predicates: when two token predicates are source-transparent, the subject is in an epistemic position to appreciate that they have the same source. The notion of transparency of source will undoubtedly spark discussion, and I wish Pinillos had said a bit more about it. Let me just note that the same-source relation between token predicates is instantiated within a file, so the relationist picture advocated by Pinillos does not in the end dispense with files. Hence, it is legitimate to explore a file-theoretic explanation of Pinillos's same-source relation, starting from the hypothesis that the predicates in the two file stages have the same object as the dominant source in virtue of being stages of the same dynamically evolving file.

In "Definite Reports of Indefinites", Samuel Cumming focuses on felicitous replacements of indefinites by definites in indirect speech reports. He argues for the idea that indefinites, while contributing existential content to the truth-conditions of the utterances, are de jure coreferential with definites. Cumming adopts a file-based explanation of the coreference relation which allows him to maintain that coreference is necessary but not sufficient for identity of content. This provides further support for the apparently radical thesis that even if an expression refers, it can fail to contribute its referent to the truth-conditions of the sentences in which it occurs, a proposal that Cumming has already articulated elsewhere.

Dickie's "Cognitive Focus" is a refreshingly self-contained presentation of her complex epistemic theory of singular reference in thought and speech (see Dickie 2015). The chapter contains a new argument for that theory as well as a thought-provoking appendix where Dickie argues for the dispensability of mental files. I won't dwell here on the critical aspects of her overall proposal, chief amongst them its scent of circularity, which have already been discussed in the literature. I will rather comment on her highly original treatment of description-based thoughts. Dickie claims that the question of whether a descriptive-based thought is singular or general should be answered by looking at the aims of belief formation, as the satisfaction conditions of those aims are the truth conditions of the beliefs you have arrived at by deploying the descriptive information. So, if your aim is to form true beliefs about what the descriptively picked object is like, the truth conditions of your beliefs will specify a condition on some particular object. This makes the thought object-dependent, and therefore singular. By contrast, if your aim is to form true beliefs about the world's pattern of property instantiation, the truth conditions of your beliefs will specify a condition on the world's configuration of properties. This makes the thought descriptive. It's seldom clear what we mean by the metaphor that belief aims at truth, but one common interpretation is that the mechanisms regulating the formation, retention and revision of belief are geared towards truth tracking. Dickie's approach, then, rests on the existence of two such mechanisms: one for singular beliefs, the other for descriptive ones. This thesis, however, can't be simply taken for granted. What's the evidence in its favour? How do we (functionally? teleologically? normatively?) distinguish between the two mechanisms? Without an answer to these questions, my impression is that Dickie's proposal just pushes the problem to a different explanatory level.

To conclude: the editors have assembled a distinguished roster of philosophers to tackle some of the most important questions about singular thought and mental files. The volume would have benefited from including a comparison with the alternative Stalnakerian-inspired picture of the mind which combines dispositionalism (as opposed to representationalism) and mental fragments (as opposed to files).[4] This criticism, however, in no way prevents me from recommending it highly.


Thanks to David J. Lobina and Manuel García-Carpintero for helpful comments on a previous draft of this review and to Michael Murez for discussion. Work on this review has received funding by the Ministerio de Ciencia, Innovación y Universidades, Ramón y Cajal programme (#RYC2018-024624-I).


Campbell, J. (1987) "Is Sense Transparent?", Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 88: 273-292.

Dickie, I. (2015) Fixing Reference, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Glick, E. (2018) "What is a Singular Proposition?", Mind 127(508): 1027-1067.

Hawthorne, J. and Manley D. (2012) The Reference Book, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Jeshion, R. (2010) "Singular Thought: Acquaintance, Semantic Instrumentalism, and Cognitivism", in R. Jeshion (ed.), New Essays on Singular Thought, Oxford: Oxford University Press: 105-140.

Keller, L. (2013) "The Metaphysics of Propositional Constituency", Canadian Journal of Philosophy 43(5-6): 655-678.

Palmira, M. (2018) "Towards a Pluralist Theory of Singular Thought", Synthese 195(9): 3947-3974.

Recanati, F. (2012) Mental Files, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Recanati, F. (2013) "Replies to My Critics", Disputatio 36: 207-242.

Stalnaker, R. (1984) Inquiry, Cambridge (Mass.): MIT Press.

[1] Full disclosure: I have myself proposed a functional approach to singular thought in Palmira (2018).

[2] See Glick (2018) for a discussion of the various options.

[3] See Glick (2018) and Keller (2013) for criticisms.

[4] See Stalnaker (1984).