Situating Existentialism: Key Texts in Context

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Jonathan Judaken and Robert Bernasconi (eds.), Situating Existentialism: Key Texts in Context, Columbia University Press, 2012, 432pp., $34.50 (pbk), ISBN 9780231147750.

Reviewed by William L. McBride, Purdue University


This is an interestingly diverse collection of essays. The editors' intention is epitomized in the title word "Situating": They hope to provide more background for understanding the philosophers dealt with than is to be found in most textbooks and anthologies on the subject. In addition to Jonathan Judaken's introduction, there are fourteen essays: Val Vinokur on Russian existentialism with special emphasis on Dostoevsky; Peter E. Gordon on German existentialism (Jaspers and especially Heidegger); Judaken on existentialism in France; George Cotkin on existentialism in America; Martin Woessner on existentialism in Britain; Eduardo Mendieta on the movement's presence in Spain and Latin America; George Pattison on Christian existentialism; Paul Mendes-Flohr on Jewish "Co-Existentialism" (Buber, Rosenzweig, Kafka, Levinas); Ronald Aronson on Camus; Samuel Moyn on the gradual spread of Kierkegaard's influence; Charles Bambach on the "existentializing" of Nietzsche through Löwith, Jaspers, and Heidegger; Robert Bernasconi, the co-editor, on Frantz Fanon; Debra Bergoffen on Simone de Beauvoir; and Ethan Kleinberg on Heidegger's "Letter on Humanism."

The fact that a substantial minority of the contributors are professional historians is both an advantage and a disadvantage. It is an advantage because there is indeed in this volume, as the editors had hoped, a degree of reverence for the facts that is unusual in the secondary literature and that makes it possible for most readers, at least, to learn some important facts that they did not know previously. In my own case, to take one example of this, I learned much that I had not known before about the evolution of Kierkegaard's reception -- just how and when his fame began to spread -- from Moyn's chapter. But the unusually historical orientation also has its disadvantages. Some historians tend to over-generalize or engage in rhetorical exaggeration to the detriment of careful analysis. These tendencies are greatest in Cotkin's essay on existentialism in America. While he provides many detailed facts, he seems to enjoy making sweeping observations about what "American intellectuals" or "American thinkers" or just plain "Americans" do or do not do. For example (140): "Americans, perhaps more than ever, cling to certainty whether it comes from fundamentalist religion or from their own gut feelings."

A good example of Cotkin's rhetorical exaggeration occurs in a paragraph about Hazel Barnes (128): "At the same time, she sought to calm the violent effusions of existentialists such as Sartre and to express existential freedom as a doctrine of responsibility." The barely suppressed prejudices latent in this sentence show a disdain not only for Sartre, obviously, as well as an apparently willful refusal to acknowledge Sartre's own important and central claims concerning responsibility, but also a probably unintended dismissal of the late Hazel Barnes herself, who regarded Sartre's thought with considerable admiration. Cotkin goes on in the very next couple of sentences to repeat an all-too-standard gross oversimplification of the line from No Exit about hell being others, when he asserts without qualification that this was Sartre's own view.  He also claims that Barnes's ethical position was closer to Simone de Beauvoir's than what he takes to be Sartre's -- a claim that, as I am sure from having seen Hazel Barnes discuss this matter in public, she would have rejected firmly.

Further, some, though by no means all, of these essays exude an atmosphere of nostalgia bordering at times on defeatism with respect to Sartre in particular and existentialism in general. While almost all of the contributors end by insisting that something of what they have just been discussing is worth retaining in the contemporary world, the theme of "the decline of existentialism" which Ethan Kleinberg explicitly names (408) near the end of the concluding chapter, is a fairly pervasive one. The generally fecund prior essay by Debra Bergoffen is self-consciously defensive, aimed at vindicating Simone de Beauvoir's continuing relevance despite the denigration of The Second Sex by writers such as Elizabeth Spelman and Patricia Hill Collins, despite the rising popularity of feminist writers in the post-Beauvoir generation such as Irigarary, Kristeva, and Wittig.

Now of course the decline of existentialism, if by this is meant the increased interest in writers who did not or do not call themselves existentialists, is a matter of historical fact; the interesting question, though, is just how this historical fact is to be interpreted. The fact itself is no surprise, given historical contingencies and the elusive nature of all such labels. (After all, the majority of the major figures considered in this book -- Kierkegaard, Nietzsche, Heidegger at least in later years, Camus -- were either unfamiliar with or explicitly rejected the "existentialist" label themselves, and there was a time shortly before the height of the existentialist vogue when Sartre himself declared that he was uncertain as to its meaning.) But another and different possible interpretation of this so-called "decline" is that it has taken place because there was something a little wrong or off-target about the existentialists' views or attitudes, or perhaps because, as has certainly been alleged in Beauvoir's case, times have changed and existentialist ideas are redolent of earlier days. To repeat, most if not, to a certain extent, all of the contributors to this volume conclude by endorsing some continued relevance to what they have been discussing, but as a reader I at least detected some muffled nostalgic sighing, which is distracting.

I shall now speak to some aspects of other essays that I found particularly interesting, without prejudice to those that I shall not mention again. Gordon's chapter is entitled "German Existentialism and the Persistence of Metaphysics." It is in the early Heidegger that, despite Heidegger's own assertions to the contrary, Gordon discerns this persistence. It seems to me that he makes a good case for his claim. I was also persuaded that the pervasiveness of Max Weber's thought, to which Gordon claims both Heidegger and Jaspers reacted, was indeed the significant phenomenon that Gordon makes it out to be. And for me that constitutes an important new perspective on both philosophers.

In Judaken's and Kleinberg's chapters, Sartre's Existentialism Is a Humanism occupies a prominent place -- in the former as a point of departure for a very informative description of the post-war so-called "existentialist offensive" and some of its critics, in the latter as the historical occasion for Heidegger's Letter on Humanism. Kleinberg mentions that Being and Nothingness sold relatively few copies when first published, and Judaken depicts the occasion on which Sartre originally gave the lecture that eventually evolved into the printed essay as the launching pad for the "offensive" that followed. I do not question the claim that this lecture was a great event of its kind, the highlight of the fall 1945 intellectual season in Paris. But it seems obvious that if, as was reported at the time and as Professor Judaken agrees, there was an overflow crowd at this event, then surely the connection between Sartre and existentialism must already have begun to be established in many people's minds by the time Sartre gave his lecture. And it is clear that there had already been published articles asserting this linkage as a well-known fact.

One example is the very positive review of Being and Nothingness by Claude-Edmond Magny that appeared in the March 1945 issue of the journal, Esprit. Magny begins with the assertion that the publication of Sartre's book is a very important event in the history of French thought and even, if it was possible to say this any longer after the preceding four years of French provincialization, in the history of Western thought in general. I applaud Judaken for giving ample attention to the work of Emmanuel Mounier, the founder and editor of Esprit, who wrote an extended study of existentialism that originated in articles first published in that journal in 1946.  But I was somewhat disappointed that he concluded this portion of his chapter (98) by referring pari passu to Gabriel Marcel, whose work Mounier certainly admired, and with good reason for the most part, but whose own flame-throwing attacks on Sartre differed considerably, at least in tone, from Mounier's very measured appraisal. The point is that, back in those days, there were Christian existentialists and Christian existentialists, and perhaps some were more "Christian" than others.

Martin Woessner's chapter, "Angst across the Channel," gradually focuses its approach to his topic, which is a very messy one, on Iris Murdoch -- a good choice, I think. He notes the well-known fact, of which Gilbert Ryle was always very proud, that Ryle had written a review of Sein und Zeit in 1929, a review that predicted that book's future importance. What I did not know is that, according to Woessner, Ryle lent his copy of the book to Murdoch twenty years later. (It would have been useful to mention A.J. Ayer's early review of Being and Nothingness, which made a prediction about that work similar to Ryle's about Being and Time.) Woessner also rightly felt that he needed to come to terms with the enormous, instantaneous success of Colin Wilson's existentialist-wannabe book, The Outsider, which apparently brought something thought to resemble existentialism into virtually every British household. I had occasion recently to look back at The Outsider, which I had first read many years ago, and I was appalled. If one wants to see a living definition of a really bad book, then look no further. Woessner handles this matter with delicacy up to a point, but there was clearly a point beyond which that became impossible.

The principal theme of Aronson's chapter on Camus is made obvious by its title, "Camus the Unbeliever." Aronson has of course written at length not only about Sartre, in several books, but also about the quarrel between Sartre and Camus. In a sub-section of this chapter on The Rebel, Aronson admits that the book has significant weaknesses, such as its inattention to close analyses of events and to the role of "material needs or structures of oppression" in accounting for revolutionary uprisings. But he goes on to say that "these weaknesses of Camus's own sweepingly abstract thinking cannot be separated from the book's strengths," notably his identification of the revolutionary impulse to replace God and then to "turn to organized, rational murder." (269) As some who are familiar with the literature on this quarrel may know, I am not so convinced that The Rebel has a lot of strengths, and rather believe that Jeanson, in his original review of it in Les Temps Modernes, was right. But I cannot go back into my reasons for holding this here.

Of course I have a great deal of respect for the overall corpus of Camus' work. And I turn now from criticism of Camus to raise what I consider an interesting and potentially relevant point that Aronson does not consider.  Perhaps we could better understand Camus' status as an unbeliever (who nevertheless knew enough about religious belief to try to document its transformation into overweening hubris in revolutionary movements) in terms of his lifelong friendship with his old teacher, Jean Grenier. Grenier maintained a sort of Christian belief tinged with Taoism and was, according to Camus himself, perhaps the single most influential figure in shaping his mature thought. I am certainly not among those, mentioned by Aronson, who claim that Camus was really deep-down religious after all. But I think that his resolute unbelief had a certain depth: that of a quasi-religious person who became fiercely-anti-religious.  The Italian philosopher Aniello Montano, taking a phrase from Roger Garaudy, captured this very well in an essay entitled "Albert Camus. Un mistico senza Dio." At any rate, I have no doubt that Camus' unbelief is one of the most fascinating aspects of his thought, one that Aronson did well to probe, and one that probably deserves further probing in the future.

To repeat what I said at the outset, this collection of essays is quite diverse and offers a feast, especially by way of historical background. I could devote much more space, if I had it, to probing any or all of its other chapters that I have not discussed here. The one other chapter that perhaps deserves special mention because of its extreme comprehensiveness is Mendieta's contribution on Hispanic and Latin American existentialisms, in which he begins by taking us back to Cervantes. Mendieta concludes by contending that, whereas existentialism was "a vital intellectual and cultural movement in the 1950s and 1960s" in the United States and Europe, it had by that time "been assimilated and superseded in Latin America" and retreated into being something of mainly academic interest. (201) Of course he is far, far more knowledgeable than I am concerning Hispanic and Latin American thought currents, and I know that he is right about the rise of "Latinoamericanismo" (as first advocated by the late Leopoldo Zea), of Marxism, and of liberation philosophy south of the border. But I still wonder whether existentialism's retreat by the 1940s was as total as he claims. In any case it is clear that the liberation philosophy of Enrique Dussel, with whose work Mendieta is very familiar, and others was strongly influenced by existentialism, as I suspect may have been the case with other philosophical developments in the Hispanic and Latin American worlds as well. Or perhaps that is just the meaning of Mendieta's term, "assimilated."