Situating Semantics: Essays on the Philosophy of John Perry

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Michael O'Rourke and Corey Washington (eds.), Situating Semantics: Essays on the Philosophy of John Perry, MIT Press, 2007, 593pp., $40.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780262651110.

Reviewed by Lenny Clapp, Illinois Wesleyan University


This is a valuable collection of essays.  Though all of them in some way concern Perry's far-reaching thought, their subject-matter is not -- as might be suggested by the volume's title -- limited to critical discussion of Perry's work.  Some of the essays directly address Perry's views on indexicals, unarticulated constituents, and physicalism, but others are related to Perry's work only to the extent that they address issues with which Perry himself has at some point been concerned.  The volume contains an introduction and summary of Perry's philosophy by the editors, thirteen original essays (divided into three sections), a response to (most of) the essays by Perry himself, and a comprehensive bibliography of Perry's publications.

I cannot evaluate all thirteen papers here.  So I will merely describe the contents of the volume, and then make a few remarks concerning the issue of unarticulated constituents, which is addressed in several of the essays.

The introduction not only provides an accessible summary of Perry's views in the philosophy of language, philosophy of mind, and metaphysics, but also explains how the seemingly disjoint views Perry has advanced over his distinguished career  fit together into a coherent philosophical perspective, the "human-theory."  Even those familiar with Perry's work could benefit from this presentation of Perry as a "system builder" in the tradition of, e.g., Quine, Davidson and Lewis.  Indeed, in the response section Perry himself wryly admits that he was initially surprised to be described as a "systematic philosopher" but that since reading this description he has been "trying to live up to it" (508).

The first set of essays comprises three papers that do not directly address Perry's work (and Perry does not address them in his response).  In "Prospects for a Naturalization of Practical Reason:  Instrumentalism and the Normative Authority of Desire", Robert Audi provides a cogent and accessible criticism of the Humean, and naturalistic, account of rational action according to which an action is rational if and only if "the action is … at least as good as any alternative in achieving satisfaction of the agent's intrinsic desires" regardless of the content of those desires.  In her contribution "Mathematical Objects and Identity", Patricia Blanchette explores the relationship between a "straightforward" view of the identity relation and structuralism in the philosophy of mathematics.  She concludes that only versions of structuralism compatible with the straightforward view are tenable.  And in "Substitution, Identity, and the Subject-Predicate Structure", Genoveva Martí argues that the law of identity supports only a very restricted principle of substitution.  Roughly, name b can be substituted salva veritate for a name a in sentence φa only if a is the "logical subject" of φa.

The second section contains seven papers on Perry's views in the philosophy of language.  In "Relativized Propositions" François Recanati argues that relativized propositions can be useful in analyzing indexical thought.  Peter Ludlow's contribution, "Understanding Temporal Indexicals," argues that Perry's reflexive-referential analysis of temporal indexicals will not work, and he proposes a Frege-inspired "sense-referential" account.  In "Is There a Problem of the Essential Indexical?" Cara Spencer argues that in theorizing about indexicals philosophers have failed to adequately distinguish between "problems … about singular thought in general" and "problems … about indexical belief per se" (191).  Herman Cappelen and Ernie Lepore, in their contribution "The Myth of Unarticulated Constituents," argue that it is a mistake to posit a location as an unarticulated constituent of the proposition semantically expressed by an utterance of 'It is raining'.  To posit such a constituent is, they claim, to overlook the fact that "the proposition semantically expressed by an utterance of S can be very different from the proposition saliently asserted by that utterance" (211).  In "Misplaced Modification and the Illusion of Opacity" Kenneth Taylor criticizes Perry's (and Crimmins') analysis of belief reports on the grounds that it commits "the fallacy of misplaced modification."  On Taylor's view in uttering belief reports "we typically do not … either semantically specify or pragmatically implicate the modes of presentations, notions or conceptions via which the ascribee cognizes" (236).  Stephen Neale, in his lengthy contribution "On Location," presents a scholarly review of Perry's introduction of the notion of unarticulated constituents, and a critical discussion of the views of Recanati, Taylor, and Stanley.  Neale is especially critical of Stanley's (2000) "binding argument" against unarticulated constituents.  And finally, in "Reflections on Reference and Reflexivity" Kent Bach raises a number of objections against Perry's Reference and Reflexivity (2001) in which "Perry tries to reconcile referentialism with a Fregean concern for cognitive significance" (395).  Bach's objections concern not so much Perry's means of bringing about this reconciliation but rather "assumptions and arguments" which underlie both Perry's commitment to referentialism and his understanding of the reflexive content of an utterance, which is the central notion in Perry's account of cognitive significance.  (I will have a few more things to say about Bach's and Neale's essays below.)

The third section contains three papers, all of which concern Perry's views in the philosophy of mind.  In "Thinking the Unthinkable:  An Excursion Into Z-Land" Eros Corazza also addresses the issue of unarticulated constituents.  He advances the view that "for the purposes of semantics, all the relevant propositional elements are the value of either a phonetically realized element or an implicit argument" (430) but he argues that this is compatible with Perry's contention that "one can think about an item without representing it" (437).  In his challenging contribution "Thinking About Qualia" Brian Loar, like Perry, is concerned with defending physicalism against Kripke's influential arguments.  Loar argues that doing so requires one to treat phenomenal concepts as recognitional concepts.  And in "A Refutation of Qualia Physicalism" Michael McKinsey endorses a particular conception of logical possibility and utilizes this conception to argue that the sort of physicalism endorsed by Perry is false.

I now turn to making a few remarks on the vexing issue of "unarticulated constituents."  In some ways these remarks are autobiographical:  I will explain why I have always been a bit confused by Perry's use of the notion, but I think my confusion may in part stem from a tension in Perry's views about the relationship between semantic content and cognitive significance.  The notion of unarticulated constituents plays two very different explanatory roles for Perry.  (In his response Perry himself distinguishes between these "uses of the idea of unarticulated constituents" [538].)  The first role derives from where the notion of an unarticulated constituent is introduced, in Perry's classic "Thought Without Representation" (1986).  The main point of the paper -- as is suggested by the title -- seems to be that one can have a thought about an entity (e.g., oneself, or one's immediate environment) and yet employ no mental representation (in logical form [LF], or anywhere else in the mind) that represents that entity.  The idea is that at some basic level of cognition about myself and/or my immediate environment I have thoughts whose truth or falsity depend upon how things are with me or in my environment, though I do not explicitly represent myself or my environment in my mind.  Typical utterances of sentences such as 'It is raining' express the contents of such thoughts; there is no syntactic representation in the sentence uttered that refers to the relevant location, nor is there a mental representation representing this place in the speaker's thought.  Let us notice that the view according to which there is such "thought without representation" is a form of content externalism.  It allows, for example, that Bert and Twin-Bert might think different it is raining contents even if they employ the very same mental representations, because such representations contain no element that represents the different places in those contents.  So, if we could switch Bert back and forth between Palo Alto and Murdock without his knowing it, he could think different it is raining contents without his being cognizant of doing so.  Thus, in this explanatory role unarticulated constituents are wholly irrelevant to explaining what Perry calls the cognitive significance of thoughts, including  cognitive significance of thoughts expressed by some sentences.  If Bert uttered 'It is raining' in Palo Alto and then we surreptitiously switched him to Murdock where he uttered this sentence again, Bert would not be aware of having said different things; despite expressing different contents, the utterances would have the same cognitive significance for Bert.

The other explanatory role played by unarticulated constituents derives from Perry's (and Crimmins') unarticulated constituent analysis of belief reports (1989).  According to their analysis the reason that utterances of (here borrowing an example from Bach)

(3a)  Dubya believes that Eminem is insecure

(3b)  Dubya believes that Marshal Mathers is insecure

seem to us to say different things (indeed maybe we even think they have different truth values) is that such utterances invoke different unarticulated constituents in something like the way Bert's utterances of 'It is raining' invoke different unarticulated constituents.

There is a crucial difference between the two explanatory projects:  In the "it's raining" example the notion of an unarticulated constituent was utilized in showing that "thought without representation" was possible, and there -- because they are not mentally represented -- unarticulated constituents are irrelevant to explaining cognitive significance.  Indeed, if unarticulated constituents are to play this role in showing that "thought without representation" is possible, unarticulated constituents cannot be represented in any way in our minds, and thus cannot provide an explanation of cognitive significance.  But in their second role unarticulated constituents are being utilized to explain, among other things, the difference in cognitive significance between utterances of (3a) and (3b).  But if unarticulated constituents are to play this role in explaining our intuitions that utterances of (3a) and (3b) say different things, then the invoked articulated constituents must be represented somehow in our minds.  The upshot is that to play the first explanatory role unarticulated constituents cannot be mentally represented, but to play the second they have to be.

Given these differences between the explanatory roles, it is not surprising that there has been some confusion as to what exactly one is committed to when one endorses unarticulated constituents, and interpreters of Perry have arrived at different understandings of unarticulated constituents depending upon which use of unarticulated constituents they are concerned with.  For example, Stanley (2000) is concerned to defend a familiar version of semantic compositionality which is incompatible with "thought without representation".  If there are unrepresented unarticulated constituents -- the first utilization -- then his principle falls.  Not surprisingly then, Stanley interprets the notion in such a way that unarticulated constituents are not mentally represented in the relevant way, viz. at LF.  I confess that I used to interpret the notion of unarticulated constituent in the other way:  I thought that if unarticulated constituents were to have any role in solving the puzzles of attitude reports they would have to be mentally represented at some level such as LF.  (If one does not presuppose that the truth conditions of a belief report are determined by its logical form and the semantic values of the elements in its logical form, then there is simply no puzzle that needs to be solved.  Belief reports are puzzling because they are apparent counterexamples to such semantic compositionality.)  In Neale's contribution he goes to great scholarly lengths to demonstrate that Stanley (and by implication my former self) misinterpret Perry.  According to Neale, for Perry a constituent of the content of an utterance or inscription is an unarticulated constituent just in case it does not correspond to any overt (voiced or written) element of the utterance (or inscription) regardless of whether or not it is mentally represented at some other level such as LF.  Now, as a point of scholarship, Neale is surely correct; Perry does use the phrase in this inclusive, disjunctive, manner.  But, first, nothing significant follows from this scholarly point.  In particular, Stanley's "binding argument" stands or falls regardless of the confusion surrounding the phrase.  (In my view Neale's terminological quibbling obscures several cogent objections against Stanley's argument.)  And second, it seems to me that Stanley (and my former self) are to be forgiven for straying from Perry's inclusive usage of 'unarticulated constituent', for the inclusive usage of the phrase masks the above described differences in the explanatory roles played by unarticulated constituents, and may mask a tension in Perry's views concerning the cognitive significance of utterances.

Near the end of his contribution Kent Bach "wonders whether Perry's view on belief reports is consonant with his views about cognitive significance" (413), and there is good reason to wonder this.  Perry (2001) argues that the cognitive significance of an utterance is explained by the reflexive content of the utterance.  To borrow an example from Bach, according to this account the reason that utterances of

(1a)  Eminem is insecure

(1b)  Marshal Mathers is insecure

have different cognitive significance for a hearer even though the utterances have the same referential content is that they differ in reflexive content.  These reflexive contents can be roughly characterized as follows:

(2a)  The referent of this utterance of 'Eminem' is insecure

(2b)  The referent of this utterance of 'Marshal Mathers' is insecure.

In this way Perry utilizes reflexive content to explain intuitive differences between what is said by utterances with the same referential content.  But, when it comes to explaining the intuitive differences between what is said by belief reports that seemingly share referential content, Perry does not invoke referential content, but instead appeals to unarticulated constituents of the utterances.  For example, Perry would explain the intuitive difference between what is said by utterances of

(3a)  Dubya believes that Eminem is insecure

(3b)  Dubya believes that Marshal Mathers is insecure

not by appeal to the reflexive content of such utterances, but by appeal to different notions that Dubya has of Eminem serving as unarticulated constituents of the utterances.

As was explained above, if the appeal to Dubya's notions as unarticulated constituents is to explain the intuitive difference between what is said by utterances of (3a) and (3b), then such unarticulated constituents must be represented somehow by the hearer -- Dubya's notions of Eminem cannot be unrepresented by you when you hear utterances of (3a) and (3b) in the way that Palo Alto was unrepresented by Perry's son when he looked out the window and said that it was raining.  Palo Alto -- the unarticulated constituent of Perry's son's thought -- has no effect whatsoever on the cognitive significance of that thought for him because it is not mentally represented by him.  If Dubya's notions of Eminem -- the relevant unarticulated constituents of utterances of (3a) and (3b) -- are to explain the difference in cognitive significance of such utterances for you, these notions must be mentally represented by you, and in different ways.  That the success of Perry's account of the intuitive difference between what is said by utterances of (3a) and (3b) requires that one mentally represent Dubya's notions in different ways has two consequences.  First, evidence that such notions are not represented -- say, evidence from syntactic theory -- cannot be dismissed as irrelevant to the adequacy of Perry's analysis of belief reports on the grounds that unarticulated constituents need not be mentally represented.  Thus Neale is at least very misleading when he claims that "No interesting thesis about the syntax of natural language is implied by the mere postulation of unarticulated constituents … And no interesting thesis about the syntax of Mentalese is implied by the postulation of unprojected constituents" (267). ('Unprojected constituent' is Neale's term for an unarticulated constituent of a thought's content.)  If unarticulated constituents are to play the role they are supposed to play in explaining cognitive significance, then those unarticulated constituents have to be somehow mentally represented.  Second, it is a mistake for Perry (1989, pp. 699-700) to attempt to support his unarticulated constituent analysis of belief reports by invoking the original (1986) unarticulated constituent analysis of weather reports.  For in the original weather report cases unarticulated constituents are, of necessity, irrelevant to cognitive significance, whereas in the belief report cases they are, of necessity, relevant.  I agree with Perry that when his son looks out the window in Palo Alto and utters 'It is raining' he is saying something about Palo Alto, though he does not represent Palo Alto in his mind.  In particular, he does not represent to himself that it is raining in Palo Alto as opposed to Murdock.  Why would this example make it plausible that in uttering 'Dubya believes that Eminem is insecure' a speaker is communicating that Dubya believes this referential content via a particular Eminem-notion as opposed to some other notion?

Another way in which the tension described above arises is with regard to belief reports of beliefs with unarticulated constituents.  Suppose that in an attempt to report to you the belief that Perry's son had when he uttered 'It is raining' in Palo Alto I utter the following:

(5)  Perry's son believes that it is raining.

According to Perry's unarticulated constituent analysis of belief reports, my utterance is true only if I "tacitly refer to" (or perhaps "constrain") a notion that Perry's son has of Palo Alto -- such a notion is an unarticulated constituent of my utterance.  But the whole point of the example concerning the rain in Palo Alto was to demonstrate that Perry's son could have a belief with a content about Palo Alto and yet utilize no mental representation, no notion, in his believing.  (I briefly raise this issue in a footnote in Clapp 1993.)

It seems then that something has to give.  I suggest that Perry could resolve this tension if he were to invoke reflexive content to explain the difference in cognitive significance between utterances of (3a) and (3b) in a way similar to the way in which he explains the difference between (1a) and (1b).  If (something like) (2a) and (2b) explain the intuitive difference between what is said by utterances of (1a) and (1b), then it seems that the intuitive difference between what is said by utterances of (3a) and (3b) can be explained by (something like):

(4a)  Dubya believes whatever is expressed by this utterance of 'that Eminem is insecure'

(4b)  Dubya believes whatever is expressed by this utterance of 'that Marshal Mathers is insecure.

Regardless of the actual truth values of (4a) and (4b), clearly one could think that they have different truth values, and we might think the relevant explanandum is that utterances of (4a) and (4b), which share referential content, have different truth conditions.

At the very end of the paper (1989) in which he presents his unarticulated constituent analysis of attitude ascriptions, Perry (with Crimmins) urges that the traditional compositional approach to semantics, according to which what is said is a function of the referents of the parts and how they are combined, be abandoned in support of the view that "in order to express claims, we exploit a tremendous variety of facts, conventions, and circumstances, of which the meanings and referents of our terms form just a part" (1989, p. 711, my emphasis).  Perry's subsequent appeal to reflexive content is a further step away from the traditional compositional view, for on this view all that semantics can give us is "utterance-bound descriptions of what is said" (534).  From this more recent perspective I in turn urge Perry to abandon not only the assumption that what is said by an utterance must be a function of the referents of the words uttered, but the assumption -- implicit in his unarticulated constituent analysis of belief reports -- that what is said by an utterance must be a function of what is referred to, either "tacitly" or explicitly, by the utterance.

Scattered among the serious, and at times emotionally charged, arguments in Situating Semantics there are some personal anecdotes about Perry, and some characteristically humorous ones by Perry.  Here is anecdote of my own:  Years ago I was invited to be a critic in an "author meets critics" session for Mark Crimmins' book Talk About Belief (1993).  I was extremely nervous because I knew that John Perry, the famous philosopher whose work had influenced not only me but the whole of analytic philosophy, would be there, and I -- a lowly graduate student -- would be criticizing his views.  But then as I sat watching people milling around finding their places my anxiety was suddenly much relieved when the following thought occurred to me:  That kindly old guy cracking jokes over there is the famous and influential  philosopher John Perry.  We are indebted to Perry for appreciating the importance of such thoughts.


Clapp, L. 1995.  "How to be Naive and Innocent:  A Criticism of Crimmins and Perry's Theory of Attitude Ascriptions." Linguistics and Philosophy 18: 529-565.

Crimmins, M. 1993.  Talk About Belief.  Cambridge, MA:  MIT Press.

Perry, J. 1986.  "Thought Without Representation."  Supplementary Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 60: 263-283.

Perry, J. and Crimmins, M. 1989.  "The Prince and the Phone Booth:  Reporting Puzzling Beliefs."  Journal of Philosophy 86: 685-711.

Perry, J. 2001.  Reference and Reflexivity.  Stanford: CSLI Publications.

Stanley, J. 2000.  "Context and Logical Form."  Linguistics and Philosophy 23: 391-434.