Six Discourses on the Distinction Between the Body and the Soul and Treatises on Metaphysics

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Géraud de Cordemoy, Six Discourses on the Distinction Between the Body and the Soul and Treatises on Metaphysics, Steven Nadler (tr.), Oxford University Press, 2015, 156pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198713319.

Reviewed by Fred Ablondi, Hendrix College


The publication of this translation of Géraud de Cordemoy's Six Discours sur la Distinction et l'Union du Corps et de l'Âme is most welcome as it is the first time this work by one of the leading Cartesians of the seventeenth century has been translated into English. (Cordemoy's other major publication, Discours physique de la parole, was translated into English in 1668.) The Six Discourses was originally published in 1666 with the title Le Discernement du Corps et de l'Ame en six discours pour server à l'éclaircissement de le physique; this translation is based on the 1704 posthumous edition of Cordemoy's collected works in which it bore the new title.

Steven Nadler, who translated this work and provided a substantial introduction (at 55 pages, it is more than half as long as the Six Discourses), is a highly respected scholar of early modern thought and an extremely prolific author. He is perhaps best known for his excellent work on Spinoza. And while Cordemoy is not a philosopher of the rank of Spinoza (or Malebranche, on whom Nadler has also done important work), I agree with Nadler's claim that the Six Discourses "represents one of the most important and influential, if unorthodox, works in the history of Cartesianism" (3).

Géraud de Cordemoy was born in 1626. His father was a professor at the University of Paris who later served in the Parliament as a lawyer. While he followed in his father's footsteps by becoming a lawyer himself, he was also very active in the Parisian philosophical circles of the latter half of the seventeenth century. He was a leading member of what Nadler describes as "a coterie of second-generation Cartesians, primarily in France, [who] made it their mission to clarify, complete, and expand and in some cases, correct Descartes's philosophical and scientific program, either through small adjustments or major overhauls" (12). Not unexpectedly, these thinkers did not always agree with each other on just what shape this endeavor ought to take. For his part, Cordemoy argued for two important positions, both of which he saw as following from Cartesian commitments. The first was atomism, which he was alone among Cartesians in advocating. The second was occasionalism; in adopting it, he would come to have more company. Reflecting on the fact that Cordemoy held these two theories, one very unpopular among his fellow Cartesians, the other an influence on many of them, Nadler remarks that "Cordemoy, with the main doctrines of the Six Discourses, may rightly be seen as the most unorthodox of orthodox Cartesians in the mid-seventeenth century" (13).

The Six Discourses, as the name indicates, consists of six sections. In the First Discourse he makes his case for a Cartesian atomism, and in the Fourth and Fifth Discourses he argues for occasionalism. As Nadler remarks,

It was Cordemoy's atomism that drew especially harsh criticism from fellow Cartesians. And although occasionalism may have its roots in Descartes, and especially his conception of matter, and while some other Cartesians -- most notably Malebranche -- followed Cordemoy down this path, it nonetheless represents in 1666 a new and unsanctioned direction for the new philosophy. (15)

As atomism and occasionalism are Cordemoy's two most important positions, they receive the bulk of the attention and critical elucidation in the Introduction, with Nadler situating both theories in the context of seventeenth-century Cartesianism. I will briefly discuss each in turn.


In the seventeenth century, those adopting a mechanical understanding of the actions of objects in the corporeal world divided into two main camps. On the one hand, there were those such as Descartes who held a plenum theory of matter. For Descartes, inasmuch as extension is the essence of body, matter can be divided indefinitely. In other words, if body necessarily takes up space in three dimensions, whatever length (or width or height) it has, that length (or width or height) can always be divided, at least in principle. On the other hand, there were atomists, most notably Gassendi, who held that any material body is ultimately composed of minute indivisible corporeal atoms. Cordemoy's uniqueness in this debate is to accept Cartesian metaphysics and then argue for atomism based on those very principles. He makes a distinction between bodies (les corps), which are indivisible atoms, and matter, defined as assemblages, or collections, of bodies. He then argues that, as Descartes' metaphysics admits only two substances, body and (immaterial) minds, and further, as it understands the concept of 'substance' to be of a thing that possesses metaphysical independence from anything else, individual bodies must be simple. This is because if they were composed of parts, they would have a dependence on those parts that would exclude them from being substances.


Cordemoy may well have been the first -- Nadler makes the case for his being so -- to argue for occasionalism, which holds that God is the sole true cause active in the world, on the grounds of Descartes' metaphysical commitments. (Louis de La Forge's Traité de l'esprit de l'homme et de ses facultez et fonctions, et de son union avec le corps (Treatise on the mind of man and its faculties and functions, and on its union with the body), which also argued that occasionalism followed from Cartesian metaphysics, appeared shortly prior to the Six Discourses. That said, Cordemoy claimed that he first accepted occasionalism in 1658.) Cordemoy's argument for occasionalism with regard to body-body interaction appears in the Fourth Discourse, though he later expands this occasionalism to cover all so-called 'interaction' in the created world. He presents the reader with several definitions and axioms, as well as the conclusions that he argues follow from them. Cordemoy's first move is to posit as his first axiom that a thing does not have "of itself" (de soy) that which can be lost without that thing ceasing to be what it is. To this he adds as a second axiom that bodies are able to lose their motion without ceasing to be bodies. From this, he concludes that bodies do not have motion "of themselves," i.e., motion is not an essential property of bodies. He further adds that a body cannot give motion to another. This is not listed as an axiom but rather follows from the Cartesian view that motion is a mode, or state, of a body, and not a quality distinct from that body. Thus, a particular mode cannot be transferred from one body to another.

When it comes to the first mover, Cordemoy argues that it could not be corporeal, for if it were a body, it would have to have motion of itself, and he has just shown that this is not a possibility. As there are only two substances -- this is Cordemoy's third axiom -- the first mover must be a mind. It is, he claims, evident that our minds are not the source of motion in our bodies, at least in certain cases (e.g., we cannot will that our heart stop pumping blood, and a paralyzed person cannot will herself to walk). But more significantly, when we limit ourselves to what is observed, we never perceive a causal connection between our volitions at one moment and our body's actions the next -- there is only temporal succession. So, Cordemoy concludes, an omnipotent mind must be the first mover. In order to get us to full-blown occasionalism, Cordemoy adds two more axioms: the fourth claims that to move is an action, and the fifth states that an action can be continued only by the agent that initiated it. Thus the mind that initiates the motion of bodies, God, has to be the very same agent that continues their motion in the present. As Nadler puts it, "Cordemoy eliminates true causal efficacy from all natural substances, minds, and bodies" (44).


Also included with the Six Discourses are translations of Cordemoy's very short two Treatises on Metaphysics, "What Constitutes the Happiness or Misery of Minds" and "That God Does Everything That is Real in Our Actions, Without Depriving Us of Freedom." The latter is interesting for Cordemoy's attempt to reconcile his thorough-going occasionalism with our moral responsibility for sinning.

Translations open a thinker to a wider readership, and this in turn can often generate more interest in that thinker, both by professional scholars and students. A nice example of this phenomena is the significant research produced on Malebranche following the publication of the translation of his The Search After Truth by Thomas M. Lennon and Paul J. Olscamp in 1980. While I cannot guarantee the same quantity of publications on Cordemoy in the next 35 years as there has been on Malebranche over the last three and a half decades, I do hope that with Nadler's translation, he begins to receive more attention.