Six Myths about the Good Life: Thinking About What Has Value

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Joel K. Kupperman, Six Myths about the Good Life: Thinking About What Has Value, Hackett, 2006, 158pp., $18.95 (pbk), ISBN 087220782X.

Reviewed by Samantha Vice, Rhodes University


Joel Kupperman's little book on the good life is an impressively subtle introduction to this ancient subject, which also fulfils its promise of engaging a general reader. Ranging through the usual suspects (hedonism, happiness, reason and virtue) and the not so usual (reaching a point of equilibrium), we are shown how each of these tempting accounts contains an element of truth, but cannot account for the whole story. This negative project is accompanied by the positive argument that properly understood, a life of true virtue will be rewarding, however rarely attained. While explicitly an exploration of good lives, the broader theme of the book, as the subtitle suggests, is an exploration of particular values and their role in making a life desirable. In the final chapter Kupperman turns briefly to meta-ethics, arguing that knowledge of what has value is tricky but still possible.

Kupperman conceives Six Myths About the Good Life as a kind of 'philosophical therapy', "loosening the hold of attractive and simple ideas that get in the way of our intelligence" (ix). The aim is to encourage further thought, and the reader is left at the end to "find [his or her] own way out" (x). This open-ended generosity of approach goes together with rigour in argument and (with a caveat below) a nice sensitivity to what would be relevant and useful for an introductory text. While the book is not burdened with technical detail and references, short discussions in the Appendix explore the more controversial issues raised in the main text. It would be suitable for undergraduate teaching and, with supplementation, could form the basis of a graduate course. In the context of the good life, students could study basic ethical and meta-ethical problems, ranging from the nature of the self, virtue and happiness through to scepticism about value.

There are two features that particularly distinguish the book: The first is Kupperman's inclusion of eastern philosophy, which breathes new life into a very old subject. For those not familiar with this philosophy, its comfortable fit with ancient Greek ethics is particularly noteworthy. The insight shared by both traditions is that "[m]uch that is important in life involves not only working on the world, but also working on ourselves" (63). The serene emotion of joy, immersion in worthwhile activities and mental stability that are features of a good life require the kind of work on the self that is a well-known feature of Greek 'therapeutic' ethics (as Martha Nussbaum and Pierre Hadot have argued).

The second distinguishing feature of the book is Kupperman's inclusion of empirical studies to explore his chosen myths. One of his claims is that they reveal the truth of much of classical ethics; another is that they show up the falsity of many common views about the good life -- hence the 'myths' of the title. The inclusion of psychology into moral philosophy is becoming more widespread, and some of Kupperman's examples will be familiar by now -- the Milgram experiments feature centrally, for instance. But it is certainly interesting to see how such experiments prove the ancient moralisers to be excellent psychologists. This reliance on data indicates that Kupperman sees the investigation of good lives mainly as an empirical, rather than a purely a priori exercise. His final conclusion is that there is a real connection between virtue and a valuable life, which in some cases is "statistically strong" (108-9), and he defends the implicit controversial move from 'is' to 'ought' in Appendix 3. The "obvious message is that, even from the point of view of sheer self-interest, virtue is generally a good strategy in life" (109). Again, this fits in with the ancient Greek eudaimonistic strategy of offering each person prudential reasons for choosing the life of virtue.

Another place in which we see the convergence of modern psychology and ancient ethics is in Kupperman's discussion of 'flow', the particular valuable experiences that occur when one is caught up in a sequence of skilled activities (5, 13). Citing research by Csikszentmihalyi, Kupperman argues in Chapter 1 that such pleasures are of higher subjective quality than passive pleasures, and that in 'losing' one's self in activities that demand skill and alertness, the self is enriched, a paradox central to both eastern and western classical literature. In contrast, passive pleasures like watching TV actually have a cumulatively depressive effect, and the motivational pull of desire "can conflict with a person's reflective evaluative judgment of what is desired" (6). Similarly, envy usually "expresses a shallow attraction to glittering rewards" which our reflective judgement would find to have little value (75).

The teachings of Buddha, furthermore, concur with current psychological work that shows the undermining effect of 'hedonic treadmills' (7-14). Studies show that subjective well-being tends to return to what had been normal for those concerned, so that strategies for drastically increasing pleasures are unlikely to prove successful in the long run. In a similar vein, Buddha argues that "pleasure requires and depends on frustration" (7) and so merely leads to further suffering. These various conclusions show that what we take to be a good indication of value usually is not.

Predictably, then, hedonism is rejected as the full story of what makes a life good. In Chapter 2, the more global notion of happiness is explored, again using psychological studies. On Kupperman's account, happiness is a state of feeling good over a period of time, along with a disposition to judge the character of one's life positively (24). The details of this chapter are subtle and rewarding, and Kupperman makes a strong case for the dangers of leading too happy a life. Complete happiness can go hand in hand with smugness, complacency and thus a lack of self-criticism, which "no reasonable person should want to have" (43).

Myth Three, that the good life is attained when a point of equilibrium is reached, at which difficulties are resolved and one's 'real' life begins, is given a particularly interesting discussion, with the emphasis on eastern philosophy. Focusing on a redeeming future point undermines the long-term thinking that is required for a prudent and satisfying organisation of one's life, lessens our attention to relevant features of our present situation, and "postpones the savoring of life" (62). In this chapter, the personal work required for a good life becomes especially clear. Kupperman devotes a useful section to the difficult lessons of eastern philosophy, which aim to unclutter the mind, to make one attentive to present activities without being blind to the difficulties and dangers surrounding them. The parallels with the 'work on the self' advocated in much of the ancient western tradition is again striking. It is here -- the responsibility and self-directed work required for living a life one would reflectively judge to be worthwhile -- that Kupperman's exploration is most rewarding. For such a brief treatment, he offers some particularly subtle lessons.

In Chapter Four, a familiar cognitive account of the emotions saves them from being relegated to the position of slave under the whip of reason. An over-reliance on rationality can "distort both our view of the actual process [of arriving at judgements of value], and also our sense of what we should be doing" (78). The 'starting points' for our reasoning about the good life themselves require judgements of value, "that ideally grow out of personal experience and are crystallized in emotions" (79). We cannot think about what is enviable or desirable without ever having experienced anything as admirable or pitiable, delightful or distasteful. Recognition of the important role of emotions, however, is tempered with the classical insistence that it is the milder emotions that are more reliable guides to value and appropriate behaviour. Once again, Kupperman concludes, this "is an area in which changing the self can be of great importance" (81).

The centrality of ancient thought to this study makes it inevitable that virtue will be one of the central candidates for a good life, and the last two myths explore the relation between virtue and a desirable life. Myth Five is that there is no 'real connection' between true virtue and a desirable life; Myth Six is that 'True Virtue is Impeccable'. In fact, virtue comes out of the study refreshingly well. If the temptation to equate virtue with mere sociable niceness is rejected, Kupperman argues, we will see that real virtue has a depth and steadiness that is revealed when tested. Far from refuting this, the Milgram experiments simply show how rare real virtue is. Real virtue requires knowledge of what is most desirable, emotional involvement and satisfaction in virtuous action (100). Virtue is something internalised, the result of a "shaping of the self, acquiring a second nature" (100), and the virtuous person has a source of satisfaction that is "inner and personal, having to do with the kind of person into which someone has transformed him or herself" (89).

However, on a less stringent note, Kupperman argues that the final myth, that virtue is 'impeccable', is attractive only because we set too high a standard for virtue. The Milgram experiments rightly make us expect consistency and stability from the truly virtuous person; he or she should be able to pass difficult tests when thrown into extraordinary situations. However, we can hold onto these requirements without demanding an impossible perfection. The way people respond to their mistakes -- for example, experiencing remorse and accepting responsibility -- and "an ongoing process of self-monitoring and self-criticism" (126) are as crucial to our judgements of virtue as impeccable behaviour.

The final chapter continues the accommodating tenor of Chapter Six, as Kupperman turns to the meta-ethical issue of whether it is possible to acquire knowledge about what has value. Very often our judgements about value will not meet the standards required for knowledge, so Kupperman concedes much to the sceptic in this regard. Despite this, he offers a brief but effective rebuttal of various sceptical claims (listed on 138-9) and argues that our awareness of the shortcomings of our value judgements is no reason to think knowledge always impossible. In some cases, we can reasonably judge that a person is correct in her judgements of what a good life could be. This conclusion is of course necessary for Kupperman; otherwise the exploration in Six Myths seems largely irrelevant. He wishes to show that the opinions of philosophical sages in both the western and eastern traditions can be trusted, and that we can draw conclusions about value from the various empirical studies he cites.

As it will be clear from the discussion so far, the notion of the good life is a generous one and it allows Kupperman to range broadly over many values. By the end of the book, however, we are reading a defence of a certain conception of virtue which could stand apart from any general exploration of value. The telos of the book is a prudential defence of virtue, a familiar and usually unsuccessful project, here given new and attractive defence. In some way, then, the main title (even if not the sub-title) perhaps slightly misleads as to the author's overall positive aim.

It is of course notoriously tricky to attempt to define what is meant by a life being 'good' and Kupperman nowhere offers anything like a strict definition of the concept, to be given substance by the argument of the book. The closest he comes to saying this explicitly is when he writes that no "specific formulas for what is a good life will be presented" (x). While, as we have seen, he argues that general connections can be drawn between virtue and goodness, his worry is that the kind of "easy generalizations" (ibid.) stated in the myths are usually flawed. In any case, however, some sketch of the parameters of the notion would have been helpful, and some of the tricky debates relegated to the Appendix would, I think, have been helpful (suitably edited) in the main body of the text.

The notion of a 'good life' can, after all, encompass both perfectionist (or objective) and subjective approaches without obvious conceptual contradiction. Kupperman is certainly aware of this, and the eudaimonism of ancient western philosophers is an extended argument for incorporating both. On the one hand, it emerges from the main discussion (and is explored explicitly in Appendix 1) that a good life is one that is valuable, and that value "stands in for how rewarding or unrewarding something is" (1). That our lives will be truly rewarding is the reason the ancient philosophers gave each one of us to cultivate virtue. This makes an element of subjective satisfaction integral to the notion of a good life, and the reliance on psychological studies of felt satisfaction supports it. On the other hand, however, Kupperman rejects a scepticism about the possibility of judging lives other than one's own, arguing that "judgments of the quality of life can be meaningfully made from the outside" (149).

The first two chapters argue explicitly that felt satisfaction is not always an accurate guide to whether a life really is good. Like many contemporary philosophers who are driven to objective list accounts of welfare by this very thought, Kupperman must argue that while some felt satisfaction is indicative of value (the satisfactions of virtue or 'flow', for instance), some is not (this is defended in Appendix 2). But we will recognise genuine satisfaction when we have it. Value then, seems to be what is worthy of being desired and what will, when experienced, be found to be more desirable than other experiences. These moves to accommodate both the subjective and objective elements of judgements about the good life are familiar in theories of welfare and in ancient ethics, and, moreover, perfectly sensible. They are supported nicely in the discussion of all the myths, but it would have been helpful for the general reader to have the parameters and moves made explicit.

One final quibble is on behalf of professional philosophers, who might expect a more sturdy and definite statement of Kupperman's positions in the Appendix. Inevitably in a book of this nature, controversial issues are touched on and left; decisions have to be made about what can be assumed or passed over. While the Appendix shows Kupperman's awareness of this tricky problem, the mere fact of its being there at all raises philosophical expectations which are not always met. But this is a slight criticism from one not, after all, of the target audience, and of a book that is a successful and engaging specimen of its kind.