Skepticism and the Veil of Perception

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Huemer, Michael, Skepticism and the Veil of Perception, Rowman and Littlefield, 2001, 209pp, $23.95 (pbk), ISBN 0-7425-1253-3.

Reviewed by Timothy McGrew, Western Michigan University


Michael Huemer’s spirited and engaging book has two central theses: that representative realism is tied ineluctably to skepticism, and that direct realism, suitably articulated within an internalist, foundationalist framework, can overcome skeptical challenges in a principled and philosophically satisfying way. In defense of these two theses he marshals a staggering array of arguments, and for that reason – hardly a defect! – a short summary cannot do full justice to the book.

At the outset Huemer orients readers to the philosophical issues regarding perception and advertises the fact that he will defend a version of direct realism. In the second chapter he reviews four prominent skeptical arguments and in the third he assesses (and finds wanting) three “easy answers” to skepticism. In the fourth and fifth chapters he articulates his own position, in the sixth he defends it against objections, in the seventh he offers his critique of indirect realism and in the eighth he urges the merits of direct realism as an answer to skepticism.

Though he intends this work as a high-level contribution to professional debate, Huemer has deliberately written the book in an accessible style. In this he is successful; the informality does not come across as condescending, and the explanations that a professional reader might be tempted to skip actually round out the picture of Huemer’s position so that a non-specialist can see why a given argument is deployed at this or that particular point. Without a doubt this would be an excellent textbook for upper-level undergraduate courses or a good book to include in the readings for introductory graduate courses in epistemology.

A review of this sort of work is almost invariably critical, and I shall lay out some of my own criticisms briefly below. But to forestall a misimpression, I want to say for the record that this is a very good book, not just rhetorically but philosophically. The argumentation is generally tight, plentiful, and employed to good purpose, a model of what philosophical work in this genre should be. Huemer is also willing to be unfashionable in some ways that are, I think, crucially right. He takes a forthrightly internalist position and resists the temptation to slip into any form of reliabilism; he insists that true epistemic principles must be necessary; he eschews the easy but defective defense of direct realism offered by the disjunctivists; he even mentions in passing that he is a dualist and shows how this affects one of the arguments. In each of these ways he takes a controversial position and where appropriate defends it with skill and good humor.

Huemer’s analysis of perception has three components: a purely internal mental state or “perceptual experience” that has representational content, an object in the external world that satisfies the content of that experience, and a causal relation holding between the object (the cause) and the experience (the effect). (p. 57) In calling perceptual experience purely internal, he means that the existence of the experience does not entail the existence of any physical object. Unlike some direct realists whose views he criticizes, Huemer agrees that a hallucinatory state may be qualitatively identical to a perceptual state; unlike Armstrong and Pitcher, he takes the existence of qualia to be established directly by introspection.

So far there is nothing to distinguish Huemer from a representative, or indirect, realist, yet he insists that his is a direct and not an indirect theory of perception. His stated criticism of indirect realism echoes Mortimer Adler’s complaint in Ten Philosophical Mistakes: indirect realism confuses the object of awareness – that of which one is aware – with the vehicle of awareness – that by means of which one is aware.

The argument for this is uncharacteristically underdeveloped. Huemer tries to make an analytical cut between awareness of objects and awareness of experiences. If we are aware of objects in virtue of having perceptual experiences, it does not follow that we are aware of those experiences as objects of awareness themselves; that awareness would be second-order, a representation of a representation. But this line of criticism is not convincing. A representative realist is apt to reply that while awareness of physical objects is intentional and requires mediation, awareness of experience is a relation of acquaintance and does not. The past decade has seen a revival of this sort of Russellian position in the work of McGrew, Fumerton, Fales, and BonJour; it would be interesting to see what Huemer has to say about the notion of acquaintance.

Perhaps what lies behind Huemer’s complaint is that indirect realists must relegate much of the inferential work in perception to tacit cognition. He stresses that the “first thing one is actually aware of” in perception is typically an external object such as a tomato rather than experiences as such. (p. 80) But there is a significant gap between this psychological priority and the epistemic priority required by direct realism. The reader of this review is no doubt in some sense first aware of the meanings of the words rather than of the shapes of the letters on the page; but it does not seem unreasonable to maintain that our understanding of written language is indirect and mediated by our awareness, in some sense and at some level, of the shapes of the letters and words themselves.

All versions of foundationalism require a generative epistemic principle. In Huemer’s version, that role is played by his principle of phenomenal conservatism (PC):

If it seems to S as if P, then S thereby has at least prima facie justification for believing that P. (p. 99)

This principle is distinctly Chisholmian in flavor, and it has both the strengths and the weaknesses of Chisholm’s approach. On the positive side, the principle is broad enough to sanction quite a bit as foundational; with this principle in hand, we can brush aside the skeptical worry that there may not be a sufficiently rich body of basic beliefs to justify the beliefs we hold by inference. But on the negative side, PC runs into two difficulties: that the notion of prima facie justification is questionable, and that the notion of “seeming to S as if” is unanalyzed.

To a critic’s ear, “prima facie justification” recalls the old joke about being a little bit pregnant. Huemer offers two rationales for employing the concept: that it is embedded in a defeater analysis of justification and knowledge, and that it is analogous to the presumption of innocence in legal contexts. Defeater analyses draw their strength from the contention that they are the only plausible way to address the Gettier problem; and this view, though widespread, is by no means uncontroversial. To those who believe that the Gettier problem is best addressed recursively in a Russellian fashion, this motivation seems inadequate. A Russellian analysis does require foundationalism to provide the basis set for the recursive definition, but as a self-professed foundationalist Huemer is in no position to complain.

The legal analogy, when pressed, actually does damage to Huemer’s case. For it is pretty clear that the presumption of innocence is prudential rather than epistemic. I am not justified in believing that the man in the dock is innocent simply because the law enjoins me not to condemn him without overcoming a burden of proof; rather, it is imprudent for me to be rash in my accusation because the damage done by condemning an innocent man is greater than that done by letting a guilty man go free. But here we are clearly speaking of utilities rather than probabilities. So, far from providing a rationale for the epistemic significance of “prima facie justification,” the legal analogy tends to show that it is not an epistemic concept at all.

Turning to the notion of “seeming as if,” Huemer makes it clear that the scope of these “seemings” is quite wide. It might seem to me, perceptually, that the room is wobbling even though I know that I am merely dizzy; it might seem to me, mnemonically, that I remember that Saturn is the fifth planet from the sun; it might seem to me, intellectually, that the shortest distance between two points in a Euclidean plane is a straight line. (p. 99) Huemer classes all of these together as intuitions, and intends PC—the connotations of the word “phenomenal” notwithstanding—to cover all of them. In fact, he sees this as a particular virtue of his position, since the principle he uses to justify his perceptual beliefs is the same principle that, in his view, accounts for the justification of any belief. (p. 102)

But a reader impressed with the force of skeptical arguments will want some rationale for taking “seeming,” thus broadly construed, as epistemically significant – some connection to the notion of justification. Huemer’s own notion of justification is explicitly deontological: justified beliefs are those that we should, ipso facto, take to be true; unjustified beliefs, those we should not believe. (pp. 96-7) But why should “seeming,” even in the absence of counter-evidence, induce an obligation to believe?

No doubt there are cases where a proposition seems true to us and where we are justified in believing it; but by themselves such instances do not support PC, much less show it to be a necessary truth as Huemer claims it must be. (p. 103) Where perceptual knowledge is concerned, the alternative of taking only experiential, first-person beliefs to be foundational has at least this advantage over direct realism: it offers the resources for an analysis of “seeming as if” in terms of phenomenal grounds, a proposition believed on the basis of those grounds, and some sort of epistemically significant relation between the two such as probabilification. But this is a road Huemer cannot take; for it would return us to phenomenal foundations and render PC at best derivative, a contingent epistemic rule of thumb justified by its track record rather than a fundamental epistemic principle defensible a priori.

In chapter seven Huemer presents and elaborates on one principal objection to indirect realism: that it has no adequate answer to the question, “Where are sense data located?” (p. 149) The question seems at first glance an odd one; my first thought on reading it was of that memorable episode in the history of the journal Analysis in which the editors offered a special prize for the best essay on the topic “What is the location of the visual afterimage?” (prompting a friend to remark that philosophy had come down in the world from the days when the hot topic was the meaning of life) and then had the temerity to complain about the quality of the essays received. To his credit, Huemer brings up the question in a context where it has some significance, and had the editors of Analysis had the benefit of reading his painstaking discussion they would have had less to complain about.

Of the possible answers he considers, the most promising seems to me to be that insofar as sense data are “located” anywhere, they are located in phenomenal space. Against this he raises three objections: that the theory of phenomenal space runs into problems with special relativity, that there are difficulties with the notion of causal relations between events in physical space and events in phenomenal space, and that physical causes underdetermine the location of events in phenomenal space. Huemer himself thinks that the first two objections are inconclusive, and as a fan of John Bell’s analysis of locality I agree. The third depends crucially on this premise:

If phenomenal space exists, there is no general relationship that a location in phenomenal space uniquely bears to any physical state or event. (p. 165)

In defense of this Huemer assumes that phenomenal space is intrinsically homogeneous – that apart from the sense data that may occupy different places in it, one location in phenomenal space is just like any other – and that as a consequence, when a physical event occurs, it is related to each location in phenomenal space in the same way as to every other location in phenomenal space. (p. 167)

Both the premise and the rationale look suspect. Phenomenal space is surely anything but homogeneous, even if we consider only one sensory modality. Visual space, for example, is oriented (e.g. vertically) and centered; peripheral phenomena are markedly different from those in sharp focus. But waiving this point, even if it were homogeneous it would not follow that the relations of physical events to locations in phenomenal space are indistinguishable. The homogeneity in question would be a matter of the internal relations of parts of phenomenal space. But this entails nothing about the external relations between physical events and locations in phenomenal space. Huemer could try to force the conclusion by adopting a stronger interpretation of the homogeneity of phenomenal space according to which there just is, by definition, no unique relation between physical events and locations in phenomenal space. But in the context this would obviously beg the question.

Even if all of these criticisms are decisive, there is a great deal more of value in this book. Huemer is obviously a gifted teacher, and his examples alone would be worth plundering for pedagogic purposes. The production values are excellent, with a layered index and – a rare find – an analytical table of contents that lays out his case in six pages. For anyone with an interest in epistemology in general and the philosophy of perception in particular, this is highly recommended reading.