Skepticism, Knowledge, and Forms of Reasoning

Placeholder book cover

John Koethe, Skepticism, Knowledge, and Forms of Reasoning, Cornell University Press, 2005, 176pp., $37.50 (hbk), ISBN 0801444322.

Reviewed by Anil Gupta, University of Pittsburgh, and José Martínez-Fernández, University of Barcelona


This elegant book develops a novel response to a kind of skeptical argument that has received considerable attention over the past thirty years or so. Koethe critically considers the principal responses to the argument, and in the course of developing his proposal, puts forward intriguing (and sometimes radical) ideas on a broad range of topics, including logical validity, epistemological realism, and the concept of knowledge. The book is highly stimulating and rewarding, and it is also a pleasure to read. All philosophers interested in epistemology — novices and experts alike — will benefit from reading this book.

Here is an example of the kind of skeptical argument that concerns Koethe. Let P be an ordinary proposition that you take to be known to you, say, that you have hands. Let SH (“skeptical hypothesis”) be the proposition that you are a handless brain in a vat. Now, the skeptic observes that the negation of SH, SH, is a simple logical consequence of P, and that this entailment is known to you. But, the skeptic argues, you do not know — and cannot know — SH to be false. Even if you were a handless brain in a vat, the skeptic may point out, you would still believe that you had hands. Hence, the skeptic concludes, you do not know that P. Let ‘K’ represent “You know that” and let ‘’ represent logical entailment. Then, the skeptic’s argument can be represented thus:


K(P ~SH)


- – - – - – -

So: ~K(P)

The argument rests on the principle - Koethe calls it the “transmission principle” — that knowledge is closed under known entailment. This principle is not indubitable; nevertheless in the dialectical context created by the skeptic, it has considerable force.

Koethe’s response to skeptical arguments such as (1) is shaped by two attitudes that are, seemingly, in tension with one another. First, Koethe thinks that there is “nothing ‘wrong’ with sceptical arguments,” that one cannot rest content with the idea that they are “straightforwardly unsound” (p. 130). He observes that skeptical arguments have been around for more than two millennia and have proved to be remarkably resilient to refutation. Furthermore, he argues on the basis of a detailed consideration of current proposals that none provides a satisfactory response. In particular, Koethe offers interesting criticisms of Robert Nozick’s theory (according to which the transmission principle is fallacious) and of Keith DeRose’s account (according to which ‘know’ is a context-sensitive term). In some respects, Koethe’s attitude toward skeptical arguments is similar to that of Stephen Schiffer, who has argued that these arguments establish an incoherence in our concept of knowledge (just as, on some proposals, the liar paradox establishes an incoherence in our concept of truth). But Koethe and Schiffer differ in one important respect, and this is connected to Koethe’s second attitude: Koethe thinks that, notwithstanding skeptical argumentation, there is nothing wrong with our ordinary epistemic practices. So, skeptical argumentation, on Koethe’s view, cannot establish an incoherence in the concept of knowledge, for otherwise it would be natural to think that the concept should be revised or abandoned. As Koethe sees it, skeptical arguments point to a “conceptual anomaly” in our practice — an anomaly of a sort that does not undermine the practice. The novelty (and radicalness) of Koethe’s book lies in how he develops and defends this idea of “conceptual anomaly.”

How can the above two attitudes be reconciled? How can one say that there is nothing straightforwardly wrong with skeptical argumentation, and also that there is nothing wrong with our ordinary epistemic practices? Koethe sustains the second attitude via his rejection of what he calls “epistemological realism.” He maintains that the truth of knowledge attributions is “constituted in part by our acceptance of those claims,”that there are “no facts antecedent to and independent of those claims which render them true or false” (p. 80). For brevity, we shall dub this idea ’Koethe’s antirealism’. Koethe uses it to support his contention that our ordinary attitudes — or what he takes to be our ordinary attitudes — toward skeptical arguments such as (1) are in order: we accept the premises but we reject the conclusions. He writes:

[I]f epistemological realism is false, the gap between what our attitudes and practices concerning scepticism are and what they ought to be is erased, and they can be seen as perfectly legitimate… . if our acceptance of the former [the premises of skeptical arguments] and our rejection of the latter [their conclusions] is (part of) what makes the former true and the latter false, then the possibility that those acceptances and rejections are mistaken disappears (p. 83).

However, if this is granted, why aren’t the skeptical arguments straightforwardly invalid? After all, their premises are, according to Koethe, true and their conclusions false. The answer is that according to Koethe our notion of validity is not as simple as we sometimes take it to be. As Koethe sees it, the significance of skeptical arguments is broadly logical, not narrowly epistemological. Koethe takes skeptical argumentation to reveal something important about inference and logical validity in general (pp. 26 & 133). He writes:

Our notion of valid reasoning depends on a certain equilibrium between our attitudes toward particular arguments or pieces of reasoning and toward the forms of reasoning those particular arguments embody. Yet there is no a priori guarantee that this equilibrium is bound to obtain, and the problem of scepticism arises … precisely because of the failure of this equilibrium between practice and reflection to obtain when the reasoning involves certain epistemic concepts… . [The failure of equilibrium] does not threaten our epistemic convictions, because those are ultimately made true by our practice of adhering to them (p. 3).

The failure of equilibrium is the conceptual anomaly that skeptical argumentation reveals, and this failure does not dictate any changes in our epistemic practice. We shall return to the ideas of validity and equilibrium after we have discussed Koethe’s argument for his antirealism.


Koethe’s principal argument for his antirealism consists of two moves. The first move is to argue that the notion of individual knowledge - that is, the notion of a particular person knowing a proposition Q - is not fundamental. What is fundamental is the impersonal notion "knowledge that Q being available [to members of a community]"; individual knowledge is explained in terms of this notion. According to Koethe’s account (which is based on one due to DeRose), knowledge that Q is available if "there are relevant practicable ways or methods for people in some relevant community to establish [that Q]" (p. 39). And a person knows that Q when she belongs to a community in which knowledge that Q is available and she avails herself of this knowledge in a socially acceptable way. Koethe observes that skeptical arguments lose none of their force when formulated for the impersonal notion: argument (1) remains puzzling even if ‘K(Q)’ is taken to express “knowledge that Q is available.”

The second move is to argue for a deflationary account of impersonal knowledge. Koethe proposes a deflationism about knowledge that parallels the deflationism about truth familiar from the writings of W. V. Quine, Dorothy Grover, Paul Horwich, and others. The principal function of the concept of truth, according to the deflationists, is not substantive but communicative. They hold that truth enables us to endorse and reject assertions, and to express certain generalizations. And they argue that these functions demand a concept T that satisfies the Tarski biconditionals,

T(“- – -”) iff – - .

Furthermore, these biconditionals are, they hold, precisely the principles constitutive of our concept of truth. Koethe gives a parallel account of knowledge (or, more precisely, the impersonal notion of knowledge, which is the only notion that will concern us). According to Koethe, the notion of knowledge, too, serves only a communicative role; its role is neither causal explanatory nor descriptive. Koethe points out that the denial of truth implies (at least in a classical context) a commitment to the negation. And he claims that we need, for communicative purposes, a device like truth that enables us to endorse an assertion that Q, but whose negation allows us to reject the assertion without committing us to ~Q. Koethe thinks that this demands a device, say K, that is governed by the schema

(2) If K(" – -“) then – - -.

”MsoBodyText">K-attributions to an assertion Q will commit us to Q, but K-denials will not commit us to ~Q (p. 88). Knowledge, Koethe argues, is precisely a device like K. (Recall that we are concerned only with the impersonal notion of knowledge.) It is governed by a principle of the same form as (2). (In fact, Koethe argues that the principle states the only necessary condition for knowledge.) Koethe goes on to provide linguistic evidence that knowledge attributions do sometimes serve the communicative role he has outlined.

Deflationism about truth suffers from some serious problems, and many of these problems carry over to Koethe’s view. But setting these aside, there are some special difficulties with Koethe’s defense of his antirealism. First, principle (2) is insufficient to give to K the desired communicative role. It is true that K-attributions imply a commitment to the assertion, but there is no assurance that K-denials imply a rejection of the assertion. This problem can be fixed by imposing the following additional principle on K:

(3) Given an entitlement to an assertion - – -, one is entitled to assert K(“- – -”).

This principle should be acceptable to Koethe, since he claims that "knowledge that Q is available" has the same assertibility conditions as Q. A second, more serious difficulty is that Koethe’s deflationism does not yield his antirealism. It does not entitle him to say that the correctness of knowledge attributions and denials rests (in part) on our acceptance of them. The point is made plain by the parallel with truth. A deflationist about truth cannot hold that the correctness of truth attributions rests (in part) on our acceptance of them. Quite the contrary: the correctness of “It is true that snow is white” lies entirely, deflationists insist, in snow’s being white. Third, Koethe uses his antirealism to support the idea that, notwithstanding skeptical argumentation, our ordinary practices are fine as they are. He thinks, in particular, that our acceptance of the skeptical premises renders them true. However, Koethe’s deflationism yields, we think, the very opposite conclusion. Suppose you assert:

I have hands. But, if I have hands, I am not a handless brain in a vat. Hence, I am not a handless brain in a vat.

Koethe would certainly endorse the first two claims. Furthermore, in this little argument, modus ponens is completely unproblematic. (Koethe thinks that skeptical arguments reveal no problems with classical inferences.) So, Koethe should endorse the conclusion. Now, given his deflationism, Koethe should affirm that knowledge that you are not a handless brain in a vat is available (and, indeed, that you know that you are not a handless brain in a vat, since the deflationism entitles you, too, to affirm the availability of this knowledge). But this is to deny the crucial skeptical premise. Koethe’s deflationism ends up endorsing the Moorean approach to the skeptical argument: contrapose the argument into a proof that we know that we are not handless brains in vats. The path to the conclusion is thorny, but the destination, we must say, is attractive.


Koethe thinks that skeptical arguments such as (1) reveal a conceptual anomaly in our notion of validity. The notion presupposes a certain equilibrium, and skeptical arguments reveal that this equilibrium does not always obtain. Koethe explains the idea of equilibrium through the following account of validity:

(4) [A] particular argument or inference is valid just in case it is an instance of a valid schema or rule of inference, and an argument schema or rule of inference is valid just in case every argument or inference instantiating it is valid (p. 133).

Equilibrium obtains when there is a perfect fit between our commitments regarding the validity of particular arguments and those regarding argument schemata. Koethe thinks that equilibrium obtains in, for example, the realm of classical logic but not in our reasoning with the concept of knowledge. We are committed, he thinks, to the transmission principle and to the non-validity of (1). Yet, the failure of equilibrium leaves our epistemic practices intact. Koethe writes:

[Our] set of attitudes would be unstable or objectionable were the requisite equilibrium between rules of inference, including the transmission principle, and arguments governed by them to be forthcoming, for in that case we would have to, or at least we ought to, revise one or more of those attitudes. In the absence of that equilibrium, though, this set of attitudes is neither unstable nor objectionable. It is in this sense that sceptical arguments are anomalous (p. 137).

We find attractive the idea that there are conceptual anomalies that require no changes in our practice; something like this idea is in play in the revision theory of truth. However, the application of the idea to knowledge and skepticism must overcome some difficulties. Account (4) of validity cannot be accepted as it stands; something essential is missing from it. If the account is taken as it stands then there are too many equilibria. We can declare all arguments and argument schemata to be invalid, and we have an equilibrium. At the other extreme, we can declare them all to be valid; again, we preserve equilibrium. A community that opted for either of these equilibria would not be working with a concept of validity. The missing element in (4) is, of course, the connection to truth and falsity. An account of validity must include a clause that ensures that only those arguments are valid that necessarily preserve truth. (Koethe cites Quine’s Philosophy of Logic for (4), but in Quine’s account the connection with truth and falsity is preserved.) This change does not undermine the present application of the idea of conceptual anomaly. But it does mean that the failure of equilibrium must involve not just our commitments on validity of arguments but also our commitments on the truth and falsity of skeptical premises. Koethe should say that a lack of equilibrium obtains in our attitudes toward the transmission principle and those toward the skeptical premises. Given his view that we accept the skeptical premises, this move would require him to moderate his antirealism.

Another difficulty with the present application of the idea of conceptual anomaly is this: Suppose Koethe is right that equilibrium does not obtain for our current reasoning practices with the concept of knowledge: we accept the transmission principle and the skeptical premises, while we reject the conclusion. Why, then, aren’t we under a conceptual obligation to clean up our act? In particular, why shouldn’t we change our attitude toward the skeptical premise that we do not know we are handless brains in vats? The change will gain us equilibrium and, it seems, will lose us little (except some dubious ideas about knowledge that the skeptic exploits). Certainly, Koethe has a strong reason to endorse the change. As we observed above, it renders the concept of knowledge more suitable for the deflationary role that he attributes to it. We are back to the Moorean response to the skeptical argument.

It is true that the Moorean response does not address the fundamental problems about knowledge that are highlighted in skepticism, both ancient and modern. These problems concern the role of our senses and our reason in the acquisition of knowledge, and the Moorean response is entirely silent on these matters. But, then, arguments such as (1) do not concern these matters, either. The ancientness of skepticism is no argument against a Moorean treatment of (1). Arguments such as (1) are of a recent vintage; these are not the arguments that concerned Sextus, Descartes, or Hume. The arguments certainly raise interesting and important issues. And as Koethe’s book shows, reflection on them can be rich and rewarding. But the depth and range of skepticism extends far beyond them.