Sketch for a Systematic Metaphysics

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D.M. Armstrong, Sketch for a Systematic Metaphysics, Oxford University Press, 2010, 125pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199590612.

Reviewed by E. J. Lowe, Durham University


David Armstrong is one of the main architects of the current renaissance in metaphysics, so it is very useful to have a concise summary of his latest views, which is what this small volume gives us. As one might expect, it is a model of clarity and rich in ideas. It certainly satisfies the description ‘systematic’ that appears in its title. Without sacrificing rigour, he has succeeded in making it as accessible as possible to as wide a philosophical audience as possible. A disadvantage of its size and accessibility, however, is that it skates over some important issues very quickly. Much that is in it will be familiar to those already well-versed in Armstrongian metaphysics, but it also includes some important new modifications of his views. I shall discuss some of these shortly. The contents are best explained by a list of the sixteen chapter titles: Introduction; Properties; Relations; States of Affairs; Laws of Nature; Reacting to Dispositionalism; Particulars; Truthmakers; Possibility, Actuality, Necessity; Limits; Absences; The Rational Disciplines: Logic and Mathematics; Numbers; Classes; Time; Mind.

As always, Armstrong holds resolutely to his version of naturalism: the view that ‘all that exists is the space-time world, the physical world as we say’ (p. 1). He continues to endorse the Tractarian vision that ‘the world is the totality of facts, not of things’ (p. 34) — that, in his own terminology, ‘the world is a world of states of affairs’ (p. 34) — and that, although these states of affairs have particulars and universals as constituents, the states of affairs themselves are the basic building-blocks of reality. And he still sees truthmaker theory as a guiding light for metaphysics, continuing to endorse the principles of truthmaker maximalism (the doctrine that every truth has and requires a truthmaker), truthmaker necessitarianism (the doctrine that the truthmakers necessitate the truths), and the entailment principle (the doctrine that a truthmaker for a proposition p is also a truthmaker for any proposition q that p entails) — even though this combination of principles has been argued to be problematic. Another leading Armstrongian idea still plays a major part: the idea of the ‘ontological free lunch’, or that some things (such as ‘internal’ relations) are ‘supervenient’ and ‘no addition of being’ — although, as before, ‘supervenience’ is here understood in a somewhat non-standard way (since it is normally understood as a relation between certain classes of existent entities, such as mental and physical properties, not between items which are ‘no addition of being’ and items which are). In Armstrongian metaphysics, a great deal of what we talk about turns out to be, allegedly, ‘no addition of being’.

Pursuing this latter point a little, we are told that classes are no addition of being, since Armstrong has no sympathy for abstract entities (abstract, that is, in the sense of non-spatiotemporal): ‘once you are given the members, their class adds nothing ontologically, is no addition of being’ (p. 8). One might have thought that if the class adds nothing, then ‘it’ is really just a plurality — the members — not an individual (since if it were an individual, it would be distinct from each of the members). Unfortunately, if a ‘class’ is just its members, there is no way to distinguish between class-membership and class-inclusion — for instance, between {x, y| {{x, y|, z| and {x, y| {x, y, z| — and mathematics is deprived of its usual set-theoretical foundations, for want of the necessary hierarchy of sets. Moreover, if the space-time world should happen to be finite in every respect, as Armstrong concedes it could, then one might suppose that it doesn’t include ‘enough’ entities, on his approach, to account for all mathematical truths. His answer is to move towards a ‘possibilist’ philosophy of mathematics, according to which ‘The uninstantiated [mathematical] structures do not exist … they are merely possible structures’ (p. 89). A key thesis deployed here, and elsewhere, is Armstrong’s Possibility Principle, of which more shortly.

Meanwhile, I wish to voice some concern about his notion of the ‘ontological free lunch’. A free lunch is still a lunch, and so something rather than nothing. But ‘no addition of being’ sounds very much like nothing to me. Armstrong’s ‘non-additions to being’ seem to hover uncomfortably between being and non-being. Internal relations, for instance, are said to be ‘an ontological free lunch’ because ‘given the terms [of the relation], the relation is necessitated’ (p. 25). That seems to mean: its existence is necessitated by the existence of its terms (or relata). But then it is something ‘additional’ to its terms, surely: they are two things (if the relation is dyadic) and it is a third, distinct from each of them. I would much prefer to say that certain relational truths (the ‘internal’ ones) are irreducibly relational but have no relational truthmakers, the ‘relata’ alone sufficing for their truth.

Ostensibly, the trouble with this, from Armstrong’s point of view, is that — again following Wittgenstein’s Tractatus — he takes states of affairs, not things, to be the building blocks of reality and the truthmakers, whereas the ‘relata’ of many ‘internal’ relations are not, prima facie, states of affairs but things. Hence, he seems constrained to acknowledge a shadowy kind of ‘supervenient’ existence for internal relations, if only to enable them to play the role of constituents in certain relational states of affairs which are supposedly truthmakers of these ‘internal’ relational truths. The idea has to be, it seems, that the relata do not directly ‘make true’ an ‘internal’ relational truth concerning themselves, but rather that they necessitate an ‘internal’ relation between themselves and this figures as a constituent in a relational state of affairs that is a truthmaker of that truth. The lesson that I would draw is that a thing ontology (a ‘substance’ ontology) is preferable to an ontology of states of affairs (and not only for this reason).

A key Armstrongian doctrine not so far mentioned, but familiar from earlier works of his, is what he calls ‘the victory of particularity’, according to which ‘The combination of particulars and universals in a state of affairs yields a particular’ (p. 27). (On this account, he might well respond to my preceding objection that ‘things’ or ‘substances’, as I conceive of them, just are in fact particular states of affairs, implausible though this strikes me.) But, before we get to that, how — we may ask — does Armstrong draw the distinction between universals and particulars? What he says — and this seems to be new to this book — is that ‘we can say that particulars are things that are subject to change, actual or possible, but universals are not’ (p. 20). He also says: ‘Particularity, I think, is a fundamental ontological category that can’t be analysed away and it is given to us in experience’ (p. 14, Armstrong’s emphasis). Neither claim seems to be entirely unproblematic. And, in any case, hasn’t he just offered an analysis of particularity in terms of something’s being subject to possible change? As for this analysis, if that is what it is, it would seem to face possible counterexamples. For instance, can we rule out a priori that, say, the unit of electric charge — a universal — has not changed by a small amount over the course of cosmological time? Be that as it may, Armstrong goes on to invoke the ‘victory of particularity’ in some controversial ways. He says, for instance, that there is such a property as ‘the biggest structural property of all, of which there can only be one instantiation’ (p. 30); this property he calls W. He goes on:

There is a particular, call it w, that instantiates this property. The state of affairs that embraces the world is w’s being W. And that is also a particular, by the ‘victory of particularity’. The world is a particular as well as being a state of affairs. (p. 31)

Now, as is well known, Armstrong also thinks that laws of nature are states of affairs, all of whose constituents are universals, and he hasn’t changed his view about this in the present book. But, even if we accept the ‘victory of particularity’, it shows only that every state of affairs that contains a particular as a constituent is itself a particular. It couldn’t show that laws are particulars, since they contain no particulars for universals to have ‘victory’ over. But, then, if laws are not particulars — and, indeed, Armstrong insists that they ‘are universals themselves, even if a rather special sort of universal’ (p. 59) — one might wonder how the world, despite containing them, is itself just a particular. Somehow, it seems, the laws must all be incorporated into the ‘biggest structural property’, W, which then requires to be instantiated (since Armstrong is an ‘immanent’ realist), and can only have one instantiation, w. And the state of affairs of w’s being W does contain a particular, namely, w, and so, by the ‘victory of particularity’, this state of affairs — ‘the world’ — is a particular. However, now I feel somewhat mystified by the apparent distinction between the following two ‘particulars’: w and w’s being W. Is this supposed to be a ‘real distinction’, or only a ‘distinction of reason’? Moreover, we were told that particulars are things that are subject to actual or possible change: but how could w’s being W possibly change? And why, anyway, should anyone believe in the existence of the alleged universal W? Armstrong elsewhere in this book says that we should defer to empirical science to tell us what universals there actually are and, accordingly, at least until science gives us a final ‘theory of everything’ (if it ever does), he should surely remain neutral about the existence of W. Interestingly, Armstrong claims that W ‘involves, as constituents, every lesser state of affairs’ and that ‘the lesser states of affairs therefore supervene on it because they are enfolded in the all-embracing property’ (p. 31). Does this mean that Armstrong now qualifies as what Jonathan Schaffer calls a ‘priority monist’?

I mentioned earlier another controversial thesis of Armstrong’s, which plays a key role in various places in this book, his Possibility Principle. According to Armstrong, any truthmaker for a contingent truth, p, is for that very reason also a truthmaker of the ‘mere possibility’ that it is possible that not-p:

Thus, ‘it is not the case that I am sitting’ is false since I am in fact writing at my desk, but ‘it is possible that I am not sitting’ is a true modal proposition because it is contingent though true that I am sitting at my desk. (p. 67)

Armstrong goes on to explain:

The truthmaker T for p … plus the contingency of truthmaker T … entail the truth of it is possible that not-p. So T together with its contingency are truthmakers for the ‘mere possibility’ that it is possible that not-p… . Let us call this the Possibility Principle. (p. 68)

He concludes:

This simple but extraordinary result shows, I think, that current analytical philosophy … has greatly overvalued the ontological importance of the category of possibility… . Given the actual world, these mere possibilities … come with it automatically, at no ontological cost. (p. 68)

However, it seems that Armstrong has engaged in some crucial sleight of hand here. What would indeed be an extraordinary result is that T, the truthmaker for p, is, all by itself, also a truthmaker for the proposition that it is possible that not-p. But what Armstrong actually says is that T together with its contingency are truthmakers for the latter. The reason why he feels free to assume that T is contingent is, of course, that he has assumed that p itself is a contingent truth. But that p is a contingent truth is itself a modal truth: it is the truth that p is true but also possibly not true. For instance, the truth that Armstrong is sitting at his desk is a contingent truth because it is not only true that he is sitting at his desk but also true that it is possible that he is not sitting at his desk. But, of course, what we want to know is precisely in virtue of what it is true that it is possible that Armstrong is not sitting at his desk — a truth of ‘mere possibility’. To assume that it is a contingent truth that Armstrong is sitting at his desk is already to assume this truth of ‘mere possibility’. So this latter modal truth remains unexplained. Current analytic philosophy is not wrong, in my view, to regard truths of ‘mere possibility’ both as presenting a great challenge to metaphysics and as having an immense importance for it. Indeed, it is very arguable that the main concern of metaphysics is with the domain of the possible, including the ‘merely’ possible.

Armstrong’s endorsement of the Possibility Principle leads him seriously to underrate, in my view, the difficulty of some longstanding metaphysical questions, such as ‘Could there have been no contingent beings?’ (pp. 72-3). His very short answer to that question runs as follows:

Let us consider the presumably true proposition ‘at least one contingent being exists’. It is very easy to find truthmakers. Any contingent being will do as a truthmaker! Then the associated modal proposition will be ‘it is possible that not one contingent being exists’. By Truthmaker Maximalism, this truth will have a truthmaker. By the Possibility Principle this truthmaker will be the same truthmaker as exists for the truth ‘at least one contingent being exists’. So, if there are no necessary beings, then there could have been nothing at all, a truth that has a this-worldly truthmaker. (p. 73)

Certainly, if T is a contingent being, it must be true that T could have failed to exist, by the very definition of ‘contingent’. But how could the existence and contingency of T serve to make it true that no contingent beings whatever might have existed? After all, how are we to rule out, say, the possibility that, in any circumstance in which one contingent being had not existed, another would have existed in place of it? It might be replied that this would violate the ‘Humean’ principle, long endorsed by Armstrong, that there are no necessary connections between (wholly) distinct existences. However, in an apparent change to his thinking, Armstrong no longer believes this, because he now thinks that a ‘mild necessary connection between particulars and universals’ (p. 32) can supply the ‘fundamental tie’ that binds together the constituents of states of affairs, thereby providing a barrier to Bradley’s notorious regress problem. I would only remark that the sort of connection that he has in mind seems too weak to do the job, for he demands only that all universals must be instantiated by some particulars and that all particulars must instantiate some universals, not that any universal must be instantiated by the particulars that actually do instantiate it nor that any particular must instantiate the universals that it actually does instantiate (p. 32). The trouble then is that if a’s being F is a contingent state of affairs, the ‘tie’ between a and F in this state of affairs is not an ‘internal’ relation, ‘supervening’ upon its terms, and so ‘no addition of being’ — for a and F could both exist without a’s being F, even though something else would be F and a would have some other property. But if the ‘tie’ is an ‘addition of being’, then it must surely be an additional constituent in the state of affairs of a’s being F — and Bradley’s regress is underway.

Truthmaker maximalism, appealed to by Armstrong above and elsewhere, also creates certain difficulties for him, notably concerning truthmakers for negative truths. He discusses in some detail the case of the true proposition that there is no rhinoceros in this room. He would prefer not to have to say that this is made true by an absence of rhinos in the room. Instead, he appeals to a ‘totality state of affairs’ and the ‘internal’ relation of difference (non-identity): ‘The states of affairs that make up the room are all of them different from rhino states of affairs’ (p. 83). But ‘totality states of affairs’ are pretty strange things, and I don’t think it helps for Armstrong to claim, as he now does (having changed his mind on the matter), that ‘totality states [of affairs] are not additions to being’ (p. 79) — a notion that we have already found to be a rather slippery one. Why not just say that the negative existential proposition that there is no rhinoceros in the room is true because its contradictory, the positive existential proposition that there is a rhinoceros in the room, is false, for want of a suitable truthmaker? This isn’t the same as saying that the negative existential proposition is made true by an absence of rhinos in the room. Nor is it saying that such an absence is a ‘falsemaker’ of the positive existential proposition. The proposal is that false propositions like this are just false by default, when they fail to be made true by suitable truthmakers.

But this means giving up Truthmaker Maximalism. As a challenge to those philosophers who are willing to do this, Armstrong asks ‘What theory of truth do they accept for the truths that lack truthmakers?’ and surmises that ‘It seems likely that they would accept for these truths some version of a minimalist theory’, commenting that ‘“True” seems little more than a term of convenience on this view’ (p. 63). This complaint seems odd to me, in view of Armstrong’s indication that what inspires his confidence in truthmaker theory is ‘the idea that correspondence with reality is necessary for any truth’ (p. 63). So long as one holds that some propositions, if true, are made true directly by ‘correspondence with reality’ while all other propositions, if true, are made true indirectly via their logical connections to that first class of propositions, one can, I think, fairly claim to endorse a ‘correspondence theory of truth’ rather than any form of minimalism. Be that as it may, it is a pleasure, as always, to wrestle with the deep philosophical questions that Armstrong continues to present us with so vivaciously.