Skillful Coping: Essays on the Phenomenology of Everyday Perception and Action

Placeholder book cover

Hubert L. Dreyfus, Skillful Coping: Essays on the Phenomenology of Everyday Perception and Action, Mark Wrathall (ed.), Oxford University Press, 2014, 289pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199654703.

Reviewed by Leslie MacAvoy, East Tennessee State University


This book, edited by Mark Wrathall, is the first of two volumes of Hubert L. Dreyfus's collected papers. While the second volume will compile essays on existential questions having to do with the good life and finding meaning in a technological age, this one focuses on Dreyfus's account of human understanding and practical intelligence, which has come to be known as skillful coping (1). Wrathall has done an admirable job of assembling papers that, taken together, offer a remarkably cohesive picture of Dreyfus's position as it has developed over the years. In addition to the editor's introduction, the collection includes twelve essays, four of which are co-authored. All were previously published, and span three and a half decades: the earliest from 1972, the most recent from 2007.

Because the essays were all published originally as separate articles, there is a certain amount of content overlap immediately apparent to anyone reading the book from cover to cover. This repetition is helpful, however, in bringing Dreyfus's fuller position into view because each time it is repeated, it is approached from another angle that discloses it in a moderately different light. The volume presents Dreyfus's position on skillful coping as developing over the years through an extended argument with a representationalist account of mind and the philosophy of action that it has inspired. In his introduction Wrathall calls this position "the epistemological view of the mind" (2), which expresses the Cartesian view that knowledge is comprised of mental representations that mediate the subject's relation to the world. On this view, actions are motivated by beliefs and desires based on representations of goals or ends. Furthermore, to the extent that actions are guided by norms, such norms are represented as rules. Thus to act is to follow a rule, and while it may or may not be the case that there is deliberation about ends on this view, it is certainly the case that there is deliberation about means, i.e., about which rule to follow in order to achieve one's end.

Dreyfus disputes almost everything about this view. He opposes this representationalist account of knowledge and intelligence largely on the grounds of his phenomenologically inspired view of practical activity and skill acquisition. While learning a skill often makes use of rules, the more expert you become, the less you seem to rely on rules and representations. While you might grant that this shows that explicit deliberation isn't involved in expert-level skilled behavior, you might argue that rules and representations are still involved implicitly. Dreyfus disputes this because experts display a responsiveness to contextual detail that suggests that they simply are not applying rules. The fact that, for instance, chess playing programs that have been developed using the computational approach to artificial intelligence (AI) are unable to beat chess masters despite being successful at winning against less skilled players tends to corroborate this view since these programs rely on the representational view of mind and model of skillful practical intelligence as rule-following that Dreyfus critiques.

The ongoing problem for representationalist accounts of mind is that they can't explain how an organism can use features of its situation to determine which rule or concept to employ in guiding its behavior. This is particularly a problem when features of the situation change. How would the organism know which facts of the situation are relevant to that change and might affect how the rule is to be applied or which rule is to be applied? This is what Dreyfus calls the relevance problem. A particular form of that problem is the frame problem, which proves to be particularly difficult in the context of AI (105-6, 249-51). On a representationalist account, the relevance problem is addressed by programming the computer with lists of features known as a frame that are considered relevant for certain kinds of situations. Thus the computer is given a rule for identifying what is relevant in a situation, but to apply the rule, the computer will need another rule for identifying which situation it is dealing with so it knows which frame to apply, and that will require being able to identify what is relevant for knowing which situation holds. So one needs a frame for the frame, and this, Dreyfus argues, will lead to a regress (106, 251).

A phenomenological approach to intelligence would avoid the frame problem because it bypasses the need for representations by showing that representations actually don't play a role in skillful coping; they only play a role in the beginning of learning a behavior. Furthermore, an embodied coper is already in a situation and is already familiar with what is relevant because of that embodiment (234-36, 241-42, 266-67). This doesn't seem to bode well for the prospect of developing a disembodied artificial intelligence, at least not one that simulates human intelligence. In developing this view, Dreyfus initially draws on Heidegger, but in the later work he relies more heavily on Merleau-Ponty. In particular, he emphasizes a motor intentionality that draws on Merleau-Ponty's idea of an intentional arc, which accounts for a kind of feedback loop between the learner and the perceptual world such that the more the learner learns, the more the world is perceived with nuance and detail that enriches the context and allows for more fine-tuned responses to situations. Further, Dreyfus argues skillful copers are guided not by goals that they represent to themselves but by seeking out a kind of 'maximal grip', which they experience as an optimal comportment involving smooth functioning. Thus they are guided by conditions of improvement and feel (147-54, 239-41).

Dreyfus has developed his argument against the Cartesian, representationalist view through engagement with at least three major foils: first, computational approaches to AI; second, representationalist views of intentionality attributed to Edmund Husserl and John Searle; and third, a cognitivist/conceptualist approach to perception and practical activity attributed to John McDowell. All three are addressed in some measure through this volume's essays, which are organized into four parts.

Part I, "The Phenomenology of Skills," contains a single essay, "From Socrates to Expert Systems: The Limits of Calculative Rationality" (1985); it is co-authored with Stuart Dreyfus. This essay articulates the thesis that practical intelligence does not involve rule-following, and argues that attempts to develop artificial intelligence using such models of intelligence are ill-fated. It identifies five stages of skill acquisition (novice, advanced beginner, competence, proficiency, and mastery) and argues that while rules are used in the beginning by the novice and continue to be used, though less slavishly, in some of the subsequent stages, they seem not to be used in the more advanced stages. The thrust of the argument is that while computer programmers think that actual experts operate with rules that could be programmed, if they could only manage to articulate them, in fact the phenomenological evidence suggests that the experts aren't really using rules at all.

This position is refrained throughout the volume and the three essays in Part IV, "Embodied Coping and Artificial Intelligence," continue this focus on AI. The first, "Making a Mind versus Modeling the Brain: Artificial Intelligence Back at the Branchpoint" (1988), pursues a line similar to the essay in Part I and is also co-authored with Stuart Dreyfus. Its critique of the computationalist approach to AI that conceives of the mind as a system that manipulates mental symbols according to a set of rules is familiar from other essays, but this essay also expresses a skepticism about a neuroscientific, connectionist approach to AI that attempts to model the brain by simulating neural networks. The goal of this approach is to simulate the interaction of neurons in order to construct a system that is capable of learning, as opposed to constructing an intelligence capable of problem-solving. While the Dreyfuses think the computationalist approach is based on a false model of mind, the worry expressed here about the connectionist approach is different. They maintain that "building an interactive net sufficiently similar to the one our brain has evolved may be just too hard" (229). This conclusion is re-assessed in the next essay "Merleau-Ponty and Recent Cognitive Science" (2004). Here Dreyfus argues that there are models of brain function -- i.e., accounts of neural networks -- that seem far more promising from a phenomenological point of view. A neural net model that captures the way the brain is responsive to the world might be able to replicate some of the elements of skillful coping such as the intentional arc described by Merleau-Ponty.

In the final essay in this section, "Why Heideggerian AI Failed and How Fixing it Would Require Making it More Heideggerian" (2007), Dreyfus discusses several early attempts to develop 'Heideggerian' approaches to AI in response to his own criticisms of symbolic, computational AI. All of these are, in one way or another, attempts to address the frame problem, and in his estimation none of them really succeeds. The most promising on his view is Walter Freeman's neurodynamics, which he thinks can be mapped onto the phenomenon of motor intentionality that Merleau-Ponty discusses. What this suggests, rather ironically given the essay's title, is that Heideggerian AI failed because it wasn't sufficiently Merleau-Pontyan.

The other two major debates are thematized primarily in the four essays in Part II, "Intentionality and Mind" . The first two, "The Perceptual Noema: Gurwitsch's Crucial Contribution" (1972) and "Heidegger's Critique of the Husserl/Searle Account of Intentionality" (1993), situate Dreyfus in relation to two important figures of the phenomenological tradition. Taken together these essays illustrate Dreyfus's critical attitude toward Husserl's transcendental phenomenology and his more positive attitude toward Heidegger's existential phenomenology. While he takes the former to exemplify some of the problems associated with the epistemological view of the mind outlined earlier, the latter emphasizes practical activity and contributes the idea, which is important to his own view, that practical activity does not require any representational intentional content (78). Dreyfus's interlocutor in this case is Searle, whom he understands as offering a position similar to the one he critiques in Husserl.

Dreyfus's debate with Searle on the topic of intentionality is important, and continues into Part III with "The Primacy of Phenomenology over Logical Analysis" (2001). In this article Dreyfus extends his critique of Searle's view of intentionality to his view of intentional action and social norms. Of particular concern with respect to the first is whether all action must be guided by a representation of 'conditions of satisfaction', i.e., a purpose or goal, or whether actions might not be guided by a sort of 'feel', i.e., a release of tension that is achieved when an action is performed 'better'. Inspired by Merleau-Ponty, Dreyfus thinks that in action one responds to conditions of improvement, which are not the same as success conditions and far less amenable to representation (147-56). This responsiveness, Dreyfus argues, amounts to a kind of responsiveness to norms that, when enacted collectively, can produce social norms that shape our social reality and account for its normativity (156). For Searle, on the other hand, social reality is comprised of 'institutional facts', which are constituted when a natural fact is represented as having a social meaning. Thus for Searle normativity enters at the level of these representations. For Dreyfus institutional facts are always grounded in and get their power from social norms, which are not in themselves representational.

Equally important is the more recent debate with John McDowell regarding the role of concepts in practical activity; the third and fourth essays in Part II pertain to this debate. While McDowell argues that experience must be conceptual 'all the way out,' Dreyfus rejects this claim. Crucial for understanding his position is the pivotal essay "Todes's Account of Nonconceptual Perceptual Knowledge and its Relation to Thought" (2001) in which he parlays his earlier view that practical comportment doesn't require the use of rules or representations into the view that it doesn't have conceptual content. This position then forms the basis for the critique of McDowell put forward in "Overcoming the Myth of the Mental: How Philosophers Can Profit from the Phenomenon of Everyday Expertise" (2005), the essay that began the subsequent debate with McDowell.

Part III, "Phenomenology and the Human Sciences," also includes four essays. I have already discussed one of them, but will briefly mention the other three here. The rationale of this section is to show the implications of Dreyfus's view regarding intentionality and practical intelligence as it is developed in Parts I and II for debates in other areas of philosophy. The essays in this section are somewhat eclectic, and doesn't cohere as well as the rest of the volume. In "Holism and Hermeneutics" (1980) Dreyfus elaborates the implications of his view about practical understanding for debates about the kind of interpretation involved in the human sciences. "From Depth Psychology to Breadth Psychology: A Phenomenological Approach to Psychopathology" (1988), co-authored with Jerome Wakefield, draws on a Heideggerian notion of understanding in order to develop a model of the unconscious and psychopathology that differs from Freud's. In "What is Moral Maturity? Towards a Phenomenology of Ethical Expertise" (1992), co-authored with Stuart Dreyfus, the analysis of skillful coping is applied to the specific case of ethical activity in order to counter some of the intellectualist prejudices that seem to dominate this area of philosophy. The focus is the Kohlberg-Gilligan debate specifically. It is suggested that if a model of ethical expertise should be grounded in a phenomenology of ethical coping, and if skillful ethical coping resembles other types of skillful practical coping, then the care perspective should perhaps be seen as illustrating a kind of ethical expertise insofar as it involves a kind of responsiveness to context based on intuition, the hallmark of the skillful coper.

All in all, Wrathall has edited a volume that, through the particular selection of essays, succeeds in showing the development and extent of Dreyfus's view of practical intelligence as skillful coping in a fuller light than any of the essays taken by itself would be able to. In this regard, it makes an important contribution, and scholars interested in gaining a better understanding of Dreyfus's position on these topics will gain something by reading this volume.