So What's New About Scholasticism? How Neo-Thomism Helped Shape the Twentieth Century

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Rajesh Heynickx and Stéphane Symons (eds.), So What's New About Scholasticism? How Neo-Thomism Helped Shape the Twentieth Century, De Gruyter, 2018, 309pp., $119.99 (hbk), ISBN 9783110586282.

Reviewed by Edward Feser, Pasadena City College


Neo-Scholasticism and Neo-Thomism went into eclipse in Catholic academia in the decades following Vatican II. They were, during the same period, paid even less attention in secular circles. What many people today remember of them is little more than a set of negative clichés, not all of them consistent. For example, it is often alleged that Neo-Scholastic writers merely parroted Aquinas's views rather than engaging in original thought, though it is also often claimed that they distorted Aquinas rather than conveying his views faithfully.

Today, there is renewed interest in Thomism and Scholastic thought in general -- among neo-Aristotelian analytic metaphysicians, analytical Thomists, historians of medieval and early modern philosophy, and Catholic and Protestant theologians. As contemporary scholars revisit the work of Etienne Gilson, Jacques Maritain, Reginald Garrigou-Lagrange, Cardinal Désiré-Joseph Mercier, and other figures of the Neo-Scholastic period, the injustice of the stereotypes is increasingly evident. Recovery of knowledge of the true character of the period will be greatly abetted by Rajesh Heynickx and Stéphane Symons' excellent volume. As its thirteen essays show, Neo-Scholastic writers often disagreed among themselves, tried in a variety of ways seriously to engage with modern thought, and went well beyond the ideas of great figures like Aquinas while staying true to the key insights that gave the Scholastic tradition its distinctiveness and value.

It helps that few if any of the contributors seem to have an ideological ax to grind. They are just doing straightforward intellectual history rather than trying to promote a Neo-Scholastic revival. In fact, the one significant drawback of the book is that it is little more than an exercise in the history of ideas. The reader will not find much in the way of philosophical analysis or argumentation, as opposed to a rehearsal of who said what, who objected to what was said, and what that led to next. However, it would be churlish to complain too much about this. The book does a great service as it stands, reintroducing us to writers and ideas that have been long forgotten. Other scholars can get on with the task of systematically evaluating the wealth of material that the Heynickx and Symons volume has usefully excavated for us.

The essays following the Introduction are organized into four parts. The first deals with the way twentieth-century Thomists dealt with issues of politics, economics, and culture. James Chappel opens with an essay on the different positions various Thomists took on controversies about private property and economic inequality during the nineteenth and early twentieth centuries. At issue were questions such as whether the institution of property is grounded in natural law or merely human law, whether the wealthy ought to give out of their superabundance as a matter of charity or a matter of justice, and whether capitalism is unjust only when unregulated or of its very nature. Sándor Horváth was one prominent Thomist who took property to be a matter merely of human law and redistribution of the superabundance of the wealthy to be a requirement of natural law, and who as a consequence took a highly negative attitude toward capitalism. Maritain and Josef Pieper sympathized with aspects of his position.

By contrast, prominent Thomist social theorists like Heinrich Pesch, Oswald von Nell-Breuning, and Johannes Messner argued that capitalism is not per se unjust and could be reformed. This more moderate view won the day with Pope Leo XIII and Pope Pius XI, both of whom condemned socialism and taught that private property is grounded in natural law. This reformist approach to capitalism was implemented in various ways, such as in Fr. John Ryan's defense of the New Deal in the United States, and in Messner's corporatism.

Wim Weymans' contribution contrasts the approaches to human rights and democracy taken by Maritain and Paul Vignaux. Maritain, a Thomist, sought to ground natural rights in human nature and to marry democracy to Christian humanism. Vignaux, under the influence of Scotist voluntarism, took rights to follow from the human will rather than preceding it, and favored a secularized politics.

John Carter Wood addresses the reaction to Maritain's political thought among certain British intellectuals in the years from just before to just after World War II. Though informative, his essay is one of several that could have benefited from more careful philosophical analysis. Though ostensibly the topic is the influence of Maritain's Thomism, the British writers Wood discusses mostly seemed interested only in those aspects of Maritain's thought that had no essential connection to his Thomism, or even departed from traditional Thomistic thinking. That some individual Thomist happens to endorse a certain idea doesn't suffice to make it "Thomistic." (As Wood notes, George Orwell liked Maritain's political views but didn't think they sat well with Maritain's Catholicism.)

Heynickx's essay is devoted to the dispute about architectural and artistic modernism among Belgian Thomists in the 1950s. Dom Samuel Stehman advocated the use of abstract aesthetic forms as an antidote to the ugliness of the mass-produced art of the day, but criticized other advocates of abstraction for subjectivism and insufficient philosophical rigor. His critics thought Stehman's approach to art too rationalistic, and preferred thinkers like Albert Dondeyne, who opted to supplement neo-Thomism with phenomenology's emphasis on concrete experience.

Part II pursues issues of aesthetics and phenomenology in greater depth. Edward Baring examines the divergent attitudes different Neo-Scholastics and Neo-Thomists took toward phenomenology in general and Husserl in particular. For some, phenomenology provided an avenue by which modern intellectuals might be led to take an interest in Scholastic ideas and in religion. But others suspected that phenomenology was likelier to lead one away from both. Mercier was sympathetic to a dialogue between Scholasticism and phenomenology, especially given that he and Husserl opposed some of the same things (such as psychologism and positivism). Yet the later Husserl's turn in a transcendental idealist direction only increased the reservations of Thomists skeptical of such dialogue. Gilson and Maritain were among those more critical of the phenomenologists. Erich Przywara, by contrast, remained sympathetic to dialogue, and thought the slide to idealism could be halted and the phenomenologist led to realism through Przywara's version of the Thomist doctrine of the analogy of being.

Dries Bosschaert examines the problems Pope Pius XII's encyclical Humani Generis posed for Neo-Scholastics interested in dialogue with phenomenology and existentialism, and the different ways the Louvain Thomists Dondeyne, Franz Grégoire, and Charles Moeller responded to the situation.

A question prompted by Bosschaert's article and by some of the others in the collection -- but, unfortunately, explicitly addressed by few if any of them -- is whether those who were interested in dialogue with such modern schools of thought were motivated by truths they thought they saw in those schools of thought, or were merely engaging in a kind of marketing exercise. For it isn't always clear. Critics of the more conservative brands of Neo-Scholasticism often complained that traditional Scholastic ideas are out of date, cannot appeal to modern man, etc., and that the Thomist therefore had to find new categories with which to engage contemporary readers. But this is a strange criticism. For the traditional ideas in question are either true or false. If they are true, then the problem is not with the ideas, but with modern readers who have closed their minds to them, and the remedy is to convince them to open their minds. But if the ideas are false, then the problem is that they are false, not that they are out of date, unappealing to modern man, etc.

Adi Efal-Lautenschläger's contribution explores the differences between Gilson's and Maritain's philosophies of art, and how these differences reflected a difference in their attitudes toward Henri Bergson. For Maritain, the nature of art is to be found in a "creative intuition" of which the physical work is only an expression. For Gilson, it is to be looked for in the physical process of making the work, understood in terms of Aristotle's notion of techné.

The essays in Part III are concerned with the ways different Neo-Scholastics engaged with modern science. Sigrid Leyssen and Annette Mülberger survey the work done by academic Thomists in Louvain and Madrid to engage with modern experimental psychology. Those influenced by Mercier were keen to pursue such engagement, whereas others were more skeptical of the "Mercierists." Mercier's Spanish disciple Marcelino Arnáiz saw Mercier's program as a way to revive Thomism in Spain. Albert Michotte did important work on the perception of causality and criticized empiricist assumptions in psychology.

Jaume Navarro's essay discusses the approaches taken by various Spanish Thomists toward the question of whether Catholicism had held back scientific progress. Zeferino González argued that Thomism and modern science could be seen to be in harmony when one rightly understood the different sorts of questions each is, or ought to be, addressing. Jaime Arbós i Tor defended the compatibility of modern chemistry and Aquinas's conception of matter. Juan González Arintero argued that evolution could be reconciled with Catholic theology and Thomist metaphysics. Some Thomists opted for the instrumentalist interpretation of science associated with Pierre Duhem.

Part IV is devoted to the relation of Neo-Scholastic writers to the larger tradition of which they were a part. Christopher S. Morrissey considers the various ways Thomist writers like Przywara, Louis Geiger, and Cornelio Fabro understood Aquinas's doctrine of analogy, and the way media theorist Marshall McLuhan -- who saw himself as a Thomist of sorts -- also took an interest in analogy and was critical of other Thomists. For McLuhan, analogy as Aquinas understood it is essentially a logical notion rather than a metaphysical or epistemological one.

In a series of books, Gerald McCool characterized early Neo-Scholastic writers as promoting a static and unified system insensitive to historical considerations and to the plurality of ways Thomism might be interpreted. Herman Paul's article notes that McCool's characterization is an oversimplification, and that in fact prominent Neo-Scholastics like Mercier, Maurice De Wulf, Peter Coffey, Louis De Raeymaeker, and Fernand Van Steenberghen explicitly rejected a static or mummified conception of Thomism. Indeed, the "Neo" in Neo-Scholasticism was meant precisely to indicate the openness of the movement to the organic development of Scholastic ideas and engagement with modern thought. Mercier and De Wulf preferred "Neo-Scholastic" to the "Neo-Thomist" label precisely to emphasize that the movement was not fixated on one particular thinker. The special interest some of these writers took in criteriology or epistemology was one respect in which more traditional Thomists sometimes thought they conceded too much to post-Cartesian philosophy.

Karim Schelkens' essay, the last in the collection, addresses the relationship of Neo-Thomism to the thought of John Henry Newman. Some thinkers thought Newman and Thomism could be reconciled, while others considered their approaches to be at odds. Schelkens focuses on the work of Johannes Willebrands, whose deepening interest in Newman moved him away from Neo-Thomism.

As I have said, the focus on intellectual history rather than systematic analysis is a weakness of the volume. Another weakness is the absence of any treatment of some important themes and disputes of the Neo-Scholastic period. For example, there is no discussion of the important work done in the philosophy of chemistry by Peter Hoenen, or of the dispute between those Neo-Scholastics who defended the traditional Aristotelian doctrine of hylemorphism and those who argued that modern chemistry requires replacing hylemorphism with an alternative they called "hylosystemism." There is nothing said about the disputes about the relationship between natural science, philosophy of nature, and metaphysics entered into by Laval and River Forest Thomists. There is no discussion of the tendentious but influential charge made by Gilson and Marie-Dominique Chenu that the Thomism of the Scholastic manuals had been unduly influenced by the rationalism of Christian Wolff. There is too little discussion of Garrigou-Lagrange and the controversies into which he entered, and even less discussion of Scotist and Suarezian strands of thought in the Neo-Scholastic period.

But here too it would be unfair to complain too much about these absences. A truly comprehensive history of the Neo-Scholastic period has yet to be written, and the Heynickx and Symons volume is not trying in the first place to be that. What it does do is to provide invaluable guidance to any future scholars who want to tell that story.