Social Contract Theory for a Diverse World: Beyond Tolerance

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Ryan Muldoon, Social Contract Theory for a Diverse World: Beyond Tolerance, Routledge, 2016, 131pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138681361.

Reviewed by Michael L. Frazer, University of East Anglia


It is now a common platitude that diversity is not to be tolerated as a necessary evil, but to be celebrated as a positive good. It is also a well-worn, if more controversial, claim that universal conceptions of justice are a danger to our much-celebrated diversity. This latter idea is at the heart of everything from the leftist critique of liberalism as racist, sexist, and imperialist to the reactionary defense of folkish communities against rootless cosmopolitanism. Not only much of the political theory of our era, but also much of the actual political conflict, is devoted to the struggle between diverse particularities and universal principles.

The public-reason-based account of political liberalism developed by John Rawls late in his career can be understood as a response to diversity-based objections to his earlier theory of justice, constructed as it was behind a veil of ignorance that hid all our differences. The later Rawls sought to defend his theory as a free-standing moral module that could be the object of an overlapping consensus among a variety of reasonable comprehensive doctrines. Several decades and a vast literature later, Rawls's critics have not been satisfied. Rawls was still demanding too much substantive agreement, still excluding too many worldviews as unreasonable. As Ryan Muldoon complains, even public-reason liberalism is still "ultimately an account of sameness, not difference" (p. 7).

In political philosophy, as in comedy, timing is everything. If it had appeared twenty years ago, Muldoon's short monograph on diversity could have been a minor sensation. Appearing at a time when public reason liberalism is on its last legs -- overtaken both by new theoretical fashions and by a series of unfortunate events demonstrating that liberalism was never really the object of either American or global consensus -- his book is still well worth reading. Muldoon's fundamental objection to Rawls may be far from new, but he is to be credited for taking it in interesting, if not always convincing, new directions.

Most of those who have previously argued against universal justice -- inspired as they have been by Marx, Nietzsche, and critical theory -- have done so in a roughly continental vein. Muldoon not only writes with the clarity and rigor characteristic of top-tier work in the analytic, Anglo-American idiom, but his defense of diversity is conducted through precisely the sort of informal modelling of a social contract pioneered by Rawls himself.

Even though Muldoon has clearly mastered his chosen method, an economics-inspired model of rational agents bargaining over the terms of a social contract is an odd fit for a defense of concrete diversity. Muldoon does not see the social contract itself as a tool for the elimination of difference through the homogenizing abstraction of homo economicus. His only objection to previous work in the social contract tradition is that the depth of difference among imagined contractors is relatively shallow, making agreement on principles of justice all-too-easily achievable. An assumption of similarity may have once been more plausible than it is now; Muldoon makes the odd claim that when Rawls was writing (that is, at the height of the civil rights movement, second-wave feminism, and counter-culture) western societies were "relatively homogenous, at least culturally if not always ethnically." Yet this era of alleged homogeneity is supposedly now over, and a new kind of social contract theory is needed to account for "new demographic realities" (p. 1).

Muldoon uses the claim that changing times require changing theories to reject the usual ambitions of the social contract approach. He refuses to construct a hypothetical situation of agreement to specify a conception of justice that ought to regulate all societies. "Even if we found a social contact that was optimal for a given set of economic conditions and social demographics," he says, "that contract may become less optimal as social conditions change" (p. 6). He therefore argues for "justice as a trajectory," as a series of temporary bargains struck by diverse parties who are always ready to renegotiate the terms of their cooperation.

After discussing the profound diversity of modern societies in Chapter 1, Muldoon devotes Chapter 2 to defending the idea that we should not seek a permanent agreement on justice amidst all this diversity, but only temporary deals. After modeling in Chapters 3 and 4 how these deals are to be struck, Chapter 5 double-checks that they are neither too stable nor too unstable. While it is hoped that they will garner significant support at any given moment, Muldoon's expectation is that these deals will ultimately prove unacceptable to those who once agreed to them. Since his goal is not to justify a given set of principles for all time, but rather to discover and test new principles, this is a feature, not a bug.

The model for these experiments in justice is John Stuart Mill's experiments in living. Unlike other critics of universalism, Muldoon seems to want to situate himself within the liberal tradition, repeatedly presenting his work as an extension of Mill's. Yet Muldoon's extension stretches Mill's liberalism to the breaking point.

What makes Mill a political liberal is that he limits experiments with a high probability of failure to the private sphere. When individuals, aware of the risks involved, choose to conduct innovative experiments in living, we may celebrate their courage, and be grateful for the knowledge that we can all gain as a result, but we need not worry that their failure could harm the rest of us. Political experiments are different; many are put at risk without first having the opportunity to offer or withhold their informed consent. And while any political experiment violates this central principle of research ethics, the gravest dangers stem from experimenting with society's basic structure and the rights of individuals, the institutions to which principles of justice are meant to apply.

Muldoon seems to think that the range of possible experiments in justice, even in a world of incredible diversity, is not itself that great -- certainly no greater than that typically seen among Western liberal democracies. The French will have their laïcité, the British their religious establishment, and the Americans their separation of church and state. As a result, headscarves will be banned in certain times and places. While Anglophones may see this as a serious injustice, there is always the chance that it will be abandoned with future Francophone experimentation. But failed experiments in justice may be corrected too late to compensate their victims; if sufficiently atrocious, they may insure that no victims survive to be compensated.

Anxieties about these sort of risks might be the basis of political conservatism, but they can also be the basis of universalist liberalism. While we may be willing to risk failed experiments in many areas of public life, we all have certain vital interests that require securing against such dangers. Mill himself argues that principles of justice enshrining certain enumerated individual rights are needed to provide precisely this security; his, as much as Judith Shklar's, is a liberalism of fear.

The relationship between liberalism and democracy is notoriously complicated; Shklar described it as a marriage of convenience, one that may be headed toward divorce in our own era of increasingly illiberal democracies. Even though Mill is both Muldoon's primary inspiration and the source of the epigraph to this book, in his refusal to place individual rights beyond the reach of ordinary democratic bargaining, Muldoon has unintentionally placed himself and Mill on opposite sides of this messy break-up.

As such, rather than a contribution to the liberal social contract tradition, Muldoon's work could be better appreciated as a contribution to democratic theory. This contribution could be of interest, not only to anti-liberal radical democrats, but also to liberal democrats. Genuine liberals must insist that Muldoon's approach is unsuited to the development of principles of justice. They can nonetheless grant that his work might help us better understand how democratic politics can or should operate within its proper, constitutionally-delimited bounds. Yet Muldoon does not discuss how his model of bargaining about justice might better illuminate the strengths and weaknesses of bargaining about more mundane matters. Although he cites several of the social-scientific works on the benefits of diversity that are typically also cited in recent epistemic defenses of democracy, the theories incorporating these findings are absent from his bibliography.

Muldoon's model is built around a diversity of what he calls "perspectives." These perspectives involve not only different moral values, but also different epistemic features. While he shies away from suggesting that alternative perspectives involve alternative facts, they do involve cross-cutting categories. For example, in order to make sense of the bewildering array of food available at a giant grocery store, Muldoon observes that vegans rightly pay attention to what doesn't contain animal products, while observant Jews look to what is kosher, and dieters to what is low-calorie.

Far from fearing alternative facts, Muldoon insists that a multiplicity of perspectives is epistemically useful. In Chapter 3, he defends empathetically multi-perspectival thinking as "the view from everywhere," contrasting it with the allegedly neutral, over-arching perspective of Rawlsian public reason, which he sees as an example of Thomas Nagel's "view from nowhere." There is no objectively best way to categorize and evaluate foodstuffs, but if you want to know how to organize your grocery store, be sure to ask vegans, Jews, dieters, and everyone else what they think.

The multi-perspectival "view from everywhere" is also economically useful, allowing for a greater division of labor. Their knowledge of vegetable protein gives vegans a comparative advantage in the artisanal tofu market, and the gains from trade that result potentially benefit all of us. Chapter 4 describes the quest for a social contract as a matter of seeking mutually beneficial bargains rather than areas of substantive moral consensus. Everything subject to bargaining of this sort gets assigned a price -- even individual rights -- but the bargaining model is designed such that "each is assured that they get more of what they want than they would have in a less diverse society," which in turn "assures that agents are rationally motivated to embrace diversity" (p. 5). Sufficiently diverse bargainers may not even agree about what they are agreeing to, but they can see that an available deal can make them all better off according to their different epistemic and evaluative standards.

Muldoon admits that actual politics might not go as smoothly as this model suggests. For one thing, some may deny that there are mutually beneficial bargains to be had. Certain perspectives may see the social world as zero-sum, either as a result of epistemological errors about comparative advantage or out of a normative commitment to the importance of genuinely zero-sum goods. Some will even see homogeneity itself as an important good. In such cases, there would be nothing irrational in choosing it over the economic gains that diversity would otherwise bring. You do not need to be a full-fledged Humean to acknowledge that it is not contrary to reason to prefer the destruction of the EU to the presence of Bulgarians in Britain, to allow the total ruin of America to prevent Mexicans from crossing its borders, or generally to sacrifice one's own acknowledged economic interest to a homogenous vision of national greatness. Such preferences may be morally monstrous, but in order to condemn them as such we must appeal to a thicker ethical consensus than Muldoon would allow.

There is also the related, undiscussed danger that some perspectives will not care about reaching a mutually acceptable bargain with others at all, but will be fine with using whatever power they have at their disposal to get what they want through coercion. As with so many works of mainstream Anglo-American political philosophy, power and inequities in its distribution are noticeable by their absence here. Part of the problem is that the agents reaching a bargain are reified perspectives, rather than the actual people who embody them. Not only does this make it impossible to deal with the much-discussed phenomenon of intersectionality, but it also masks the fact that some are the perspectives of majorities and some are perspectives of minorities, that some are perspectives of the oppressors and some of the oppressed.

In order to insure that voluntary bargaining takes place at all, Muldoon may have to depend on much more moral uniformity than he thinks. The public consensus needed to avoid coercion might even have to look a great deal like the sort of Rawlsian reasonableness that Muldoon opposes. Revised versions of Rawls's political liberalism need not rely on a single, allegedly neutral perspective of public reason, but instead on a basic moral commitment that those with otherwise opposing perspectives can share. This moral commitment might be better described as a matter of reciprocity or mutual respect rather than in Rawls's own language of reasonableness. However, it will involve the same desire to see others freely adopt the social arrangements that one is proposing, and an unwillingness to impose them by force whenever others are also unwilling to do so.

There is no denying that this moral commitment to reciprocity is in some sense a liberal one, and that anyone who shares it is already on the road to political liberalism. Muldoon rejects such an approach as unrealistic;

it would be appropriate if the world were now full of Rawlsian political liberals, but instead we find ourselves in a world that is more likely than before for people to encounter others who have substantially different comprehensive moral doctrines, and who see the world in quite different terms. (p. 2)

Although non-ideal theory and political realism are all the rage right now, Muldoon needs to be careful about exactly how non-ideal his version of social contract theory is meant to be. Increasing the amount of diversity that a model of a social contract assumes does not make it any less ideal. Remember, diversity itself is an ideal -- one of the most powerful ideals of our time. If we were to be thorough-going realists -- doing theory for the sort of grim world described by political scientists like Christopher Achen and Larry M. Bartels -- we would have to describe a social contract for agents who are not only extremely different from one another, but also epistemically irresponsible, prudentially myopic, and preeminently concerned with signaling loyalty to various identity groups.

Learning that this is what our fellow citizens are really like may make it impossible to move "beyond tolerance," or even so much as to achieve it. Our unreasonable political opponents deserve only agonistic respect; they are not to be degraded or dehumanized, but they must be defeated if liberal democracy is to survive. One thing we must not do is tolerate them in the name of a misguided ideal of diversity; that a society is more diverse when it contains a broad array of fascistic deplorables is not something to be said in its favor. Multiple perspectives certainly have their epistemic uses -- and one of the greatest arguments for liberalism is its compatibility with a very wide range of moral doctrines -- but diversity as such is not the summum bonum of politics.