Social Conventions: From Language to Law

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Andrei Marmor, Social Conventions: From Language to Law, Princeton UP, 2009, 186pp., $39.50 (hbk), ISBN 9780691140902.

Reviewed by Michael Giudice, York University



The concept of convention forms part of the structure of several areas of social thought and discourse, from games to fashion, etiquette, language, morality, and law. In these areas the concept of convention is closely associated with the idea of norms, as identification of a convention is typically understood as identification of a norm of some kind to do or not do something. If a broad and proper understanding of how norms function in diverse social contexts is to be developed, the concept of convention clearly merits analysis. Unlike other books, which tend to focus only on the nature of conventions in particular contexts, Andrei Marmor’s new book Social Conventions: From Language to Law attempts to step back and examine the nature of conventions across a much broader range of domains. This rationale alone makes Social Conventions a must read for philosophers working in diverse areas.

Social Conventions is divided into two main parts. The first part, composed of a preface and the first three chapters, offers a refined account of the nature of conventions. The second part, composed of chapters four to seven, applies various elements of the account to language, morality, and law. A brief summary of each chapter will be useful to identify the book’s content and interest before providing some critical observations.

In the Preface, Marmor contends that conventions are particularly interesting, philosophically, in light of two plausible assumptions. First, they are ‘a species of norms; they are rules that regulate human conduct’ (x). As such, investigation of their nature forms part of any complete practical philosophy of how various features of social life figure in what we ought to do. Second, conventional norms are unique: ‘Inspite of the great diversity of domains in which we follow conventions, they share an essential feature, namely, their arbitrariness’ (x). Part of the task of a complete practical philosophy therefore includes investigation of the role of conventional norms in practical reasoning. In chapter one, ‘A First Look at the Nature of Conventions’, Marmor begins that task and sets out to explain and defend more fully a general account of the nature of conventional norms, summarized in terms of three conditions:

1. There is a group of people, a population, P, that normally follows R in circumstances C.

2. There is a reason, or a combination of reasons, call it A, for members of P to follow R in circumstances C.

3. There is at least one other potential rule, S, that if members of P had actually followed in circumstances C, then A would have been a sufficient reason for members of P to follow S instead of R in circumstances C, and at least partly because S is the rule generally followed instead of R. The rules R and S are such that it is impossible (or pointless) to comply with both of them concomitantly in circumstances C. (2)

Condition 1 indicates that conventions are social rules; a convention only exists if it is followed as a matter of social fact. Condition 2 indicates two features of conventions: (i) conventions exist where practical reason is underdetermined, and (ii) conventions themselves do not provide complete reasons for following them, as there are always reasons (or it is always sensible to ask about reasons) for following conventional norms. Condition 3 indicates the sense in which conventions are arbitrary (or ‘path-dependent’), and how the reasons they provide are compliance-dependent: the reason for following a conventional norm partly depends on the fact that others follow it (10-12).

The account of conventions provided in chapter one is fairly general, and might be accurately characterized as a genus-level account of conventions. Chapters two and three identify and explain two particular variations among conventions. Chapter two, ‘Constitutive Conventions’, distinguishes between (i) coordination conventions of the kind explained by David Lewis, and (ii) constitutive conventions, a type of convention Marmor has been exploring for several years. I will take up in further detail below Marmor’s argument for the difference between the two types of conventions. In chapter three, ‘Deep Conventions’, Marmor draws a difference between surface conventions and deep conventions (58-9). There are several differences between surface and deep conventions, which are measured along the dimensions of their proximity as responses to basic social needs, their amenability to change, the possibility of their codification (understood as replacement by institutional rules), and whether one can exist or be practiced without the other (as Marmor explains, surface conventions ‘instantiate’ and are made possible by deep conventions). Marmor offers several interesting examples from games, art, and language to illustrate the difference.

In chapters four and five Marmor applies his account of conventions to language. These chapters contain much of interest to philosophers of language, exploring several aspects of literal meaning, notation, implicatures, and speech act theory, but I can only highlight some of the main claims here given the context of this review. These discussions arrive under Marmor’s overarching attempt to subject to close philosophical scrutiny several popular yet insufficiently thought out views such as ‘language is conventional’, ‘meaning is conventional’, ‘meaning is use’, and other allied expressions. Marmor’s first observation is that natural languages have many features and aspects, only some of which are conventional. Here the going gets especially interesting: in Marmor’s view, the conventional aspects of language are far fewer than we might think. In chapter four, ‘Conventions of Language: Semantics’, Marmor argues that while the notational aspects of language are conventional (sound-sense relations and relations between script and sound), ‘[t]he literal meaning of many, if not most, words in a natural language is not, basically, conventional’ (83). In Marmor’s view, the core meaning and core cases of many words and linguistic expressions, and so the norms governing their use, do not admit of alternatives. The argument is complex and nuanced, but it might be summarized as follows. For certain words, ranging from colours to social activities to logical connectives, the reasons for having the words determine the core of their literal meaning. For example, there is a reason for having the word ‘art’ since, despite variations, there are core cases and so ‘a range of objects within the definite extension of the word’ (93). In this way, norms based on the reasons for having words with literal meanings do not seem to admit of alternatives. In chapter five, ‘Conventions of Language: Pragmatics’, Marmor turns to investigation of the possibility of conventional implicatures and the role of conventions in performative speech acts. Again, the argument is complex and nuanced, and the conclusion about semantically implied content and speech acts is much the same as the conclusion about literal meaning, and for similar reasons: far less is conventional than we might think. In general, I think much of the value of chapters four and five lies in the details of Marmor’s argument, and the important criticisms he levels against the views of influential philosophers such as Wittgenstein, Grice, Searle, and others. Perhaps most importantly, Marmor shows how many blanket expressions about the conventionality of language are both unsafe and often plainly inaccurate.

Chapter six, ‘The Morality of Conventions’, turns from linguistic conventions to moral conventions. Marmor’s target in this short chapter is quite specific. He assumes that most basic requirements of morality are not reasons or norms that are arbitrary or path- or compliance-dependent. A basic requirement not to torture simply does not admit of alternatives which could serve the same function, nor does following a norm against torture depend in any way on the social fact that others follow it. Yet Marmor is focused not on basic or general-level requirements, but instead the particular instantiations of general or basic moral reasons in favor or against certain courses of action in which there is an element of contingency and path-dependency. For example, while having a general norm to keep promises is not a matter of convention, the particular ways in which we might make or carry out promises in particular times and places is contingent and path-dependent. This feature of conventionality in application of moral norms is of great interest, since it is at the heart of many disagreements regarding the requirements of morality. More specifically, Marmor shows quite nicely that the particular interest in understanding the conventionality of morality lies in the weight or strength of contingent and path-dependent aspects of morality. His conclusion is that the reasons for complying with moral conventions are typically weak reasons, and it is precisely the conventional aspect, not the moral aspect, which makes them weak reasons.

In chapter seven, ‘The Conventional Foundations of Law’, Marmor takes up a longstanding question over the conventionality of the central, system-constituting rule of recognition in H.L.A. Hart’s theory of law. As Hart explains it, the rule of recognition is the foundational norm found in all modern legal systems, and consists in a practice of judges and other legal officials of identifying and using some sources of law as opposed to others.1 Several advocates of Hart’s view deny, despite Hart’s own words, that the rule of recognition really is conventional.2 Marmor argues that such denial rests quite simply on a mistaken understanding of the nature of conventions. We can only see clearly the conventional nature of the foundations of law, he argues, once we understand the distinctions between surface and deep conventions, and between coordination and constitutive conventions. Judges and legal officials practice conventional norms in the identification of laws, since their norms admit of alternatives, but their reasons for doing so are not limited to the fact that others do the same. Rather, judges and legal officials rely on a plurality of inter-related reasons including the fact that there are deep conventions, and most importantly moral reasons that support the conventional practices of following precedent, applying the norms of legislatures, etc.

Anyone working on the conventional nature or aspects of language, morality, or law will need to read Social Conventions. Marmor brings considerable analytical rigour to identifying the limits and shortcomings of previous views, and so clearly sets the standard for any future work on conventional norms. I worry, however, that there are some significant shortcomings in one crucial part of the book, namely the argument for the introduction of ‘constitutive conventions’ to explain conventional norms that are not coordination conventions. I shall explore these shortcomings in the remainder of this review.

Much of the rationale of Social Conventions is the motivation to go beyond David Lewis’s longstanding dominant theory of coordination conventions. As Marmor states, ‘the main problem with Lewis’s analysis concerns its scope’ (22). In Marmor’s view, while many conventions are best viewed as solutions to large-scale coordination problems in the way Lewis explains, many conventions are not. In the book and in his previous work Marmor uses the game of chess as a central analogy in explanation of conventions that are not coordination conventions. He asks,

Does it make sense to suggest that the rules of chess are there to solve a coordination problem between potential chess players? … Of course you can structure a very vague and highly general coordination problem, say, a desire to play some intellectual board game … The obvious difficulty is that such a coordination problem would be too abstract and underspecified. (23)

Notice that there are two options for understanding conventions which might appear to serve as solutions to highly abstract and underspecified coordination problems. The first option, which Marmor chooses, is to deny that the problems are really problems of coordination. In Marmor’s view, where coordination problems really are too abstract and underspecified, they cannot really be coordination problems at all, but must be some kind of other problem. But what kind of other problem? If a constitutive convention is the solution, then presumably the problem must be a constitutive problem. Marmor states that constitutive conventions ‘tend to emerge as responses to complex social and human needs’ (170). Here we need to ask: what precisely is it about complex social and human needs that is problematic? This seems a plausible question to ask, especially since the emergence conditions of a convention are not identical to the reasons why the emergent convention is needed or relevant. It must also remain an open question whether a convention really solves its original problem. Still, we might say that since constitutive conventions constitute social practices where they did not previously exist, constitutive problems might simply be the absence of social practices where they are needed as responses to ‘complex social and human needs’. It is difficult to say much more than this, as Marmor provides little indication about what exactly a constitutive problem is, or how to spot one by means of identifying criteria for the set of constitutive problems or the individual members; for this reason there might be an imbalance in Marmor’s account between the types of conventions which serve as solutions to problems, and the types of problems which are in need of solutions in terms of conventions. The second option in characterizing coordination problems that are highly abstract and underspecified is of course to acknowledge that some particular coordination problems really are quite difficult precisely because they are very abstract and underspecified. On this understanding, abstractness and underspecification mark the extent or degree of difficulty of a coordination problem, rather than a change in the very nature of the problem.

There is, however, more to the distinction between constitutive and coordination conventions. Marmor supposes that,

More importantly, there is something seriously amiss about the suggestion to characterize the rationale of playing chess as a solution to a coordination problem. When asked, for example, why I drive on the right side of the road, it makes perfect sense to reply that I do it because I need to coordinate my driving with others. But when asked why I play chess right now, it would be perplexing to reply that I do it because I need to coordinate my behavior with my fellow players. (23-4)

There is an important change in the level of comparison here. As Marmor states in the preface to the book, his account is meant to be at the level of norms: as he says, conventions are ‘a species of norms; they are rules that regulate human conduct’ (x). Yet in the comparison between driving on the right and playing chess, Marmor moves from comparing reasons for following particular norms to rationales for playing games. If the comparison is made at the right level, the difference might disappear: one’s rationale for playing the game of chess would not include a need to coordinate behavior, but likewise one’s rationale for accepting a system of traffic laws, or any system of laws regulating important conduct, would be misunderstood if characterized simply as the need to coordinate behaviour with fellow citizens (since one’s rationale, above and beyond reasons to follow particular rules or laws, would be something such as the common good or avoidance of harm). At the level of particular rules, reasons for following the particular rules of chess — for example, how one must move one’s rook — look quite similar to the reasons for following particular rules of traffic, for example, driving on the right. Marmor’s stark contrast between chess and traffic rules, which he employs to support the distinction between constitutive conventions and coordination conventions, only seems successful by sliding between two very different levels of comparison.

Perhaps the way out of this problem is to argue not that constitutive conventions and coordination conventions apply to different kinds of norms, but instead each applies at a different level of analysis: coordination conventions apply at the level of particular norms, while constitutive conventions apply at the level of entire social practices, such as games or law. We could then say that the problem Marmor identifies with Lewis’s account of conventions is not one of scope but level of analysis. If this is the solution, though, Marmor’s assumption that conventions are species of norms would have to be given up. Yet even so, further questions remain. What exactly is a constitutive problem, to which a constitutive convention is required as a solution? Or, if there is no specific kind of problem properly identified as ‘constitutive,’ and instead constitutive conventions arise in response to a range of quite diverse social problems, what are those problems or perhaps the characteristics of some of those families or sets of problems? Alternatively, why couldn’t a dyed-in-the-wool Lewisian dig her heels in and maintain that some coordination problems simply are very abstract and underspecified (in other words, why should we believe there is some threshold of abstractness and underspecification which, if met, shows that a coordination problem has become a constitutive problem)?

Questions about the level at which an account of conventions applies, and the nature of the problems to which different types of conventions are solutions, are no doubt of great importance. Using law as an example, some further questions emerge. If not only particular legal rules are conventional, but also particular legal practices or perhaps areas of law, we might also ask about the extent to which particular types of legal order are conventional. Given recent and growing interest in the variety of types of law, we might ask about the extent to which state law, or the structure of a state legal system, is conventional in form.3 Here we might compare state law with various forms of non-state law, such as international law, transnational law, or diverse forms of regional integration such as the European Union. Along these lines Marmor suggests that the differences between common-law and continental law traditions, and the differences between these and feudal law and Roman law, are best characterized as different types of deep conventions (172-4). Marmor’s discussion in this part of the book is intriguing, albeit short and underdeveloped. Regarding different types of problems to which different types of conventions are required as solutions, we might attempt to gain a better understanding of the need for different forms of legal regulation by considering contexts where the problems are presently unsolved. Two current examples are useful. First, is the problem of global climate change or environmental damage a coordination problem or a constitutive problem? Or is it some kind of other problem, to which a convention is not the right kind of solution? Second, are deficiencies of justice in practices of global trade (which tend to be detrimental to developing nations) coordination, constitutive, or some other kind of problem (beyond simply being deficiencies of justice)?

I suspect some of the tools required to answer these questions and others are in Social Conventions, but more work remains in specifying the different types of problems to which different types of conventions are (or are not) solutions. Unfinished business does not, however, diminish the value of Marmor’s new book. Social Conventions admirably clears the ground for subsequent work on the nature of conventions, and fruitfully casts various debates about aspects of language, morality, and law in a new light.

1 H.L.A. Hart, The Concept of Law, 2nd ed. (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1994).

2 See, e.g., Leslie Green, ‘Positivism and Conventionalism’, 12 Canadian Journal of Law and Jurisprudence (1999), 35-52; and Julie Dickson, ‘Is the Rule of Recognition Really a Conventional Rule?’, 27 Oxford Journal of Legal Studies (2007), 373.

3 See, for example, Brian Tamanaha, A General Jurisprudence of Law and Society (Oxford: Oxford UP, 2001), and William Twining, General Jurisprudence: Understanding Law from a Global Perspective (Cambridge: Cambridge UP, 2009).