Social Dynamics

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Brian Skyrms, Social Dynamics, Oxford University Press, 2014, 339pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780199652839.

Reviewed by Cédric Paternotte, Munich Center for Mathematical Philosophy, Ludwig-Maximilians-Universität München


How should we study social phenomena such as cooperation, fairness and communication? Many philosophers try to define some of them analytically -- to find out what distinguishes conventions from social norms and communication from deception, for instance. Other philosophers and scientists study the cognitive mechanisms underlying our cooperative, fair and communicative behaviour. Others still explore the evolutionary origins of such mechanisms and wonder whether they could have been adaptive. Brian Skyrms' latest book -- a collection of papers spanning about two decades -- belongs to this third category, that of ultimate explanations. It investigates the evolution of various social phenomena through multiple formal methods, in order to provide partial explanations based on cultural evolution and reinforcement learning.

Although collections of papers typically provide an exploded view of the author's take on one field, Skyrms puts forward a number of general claims, which concern either the evolution of sociality or the methodology of its study -- the way in which it should be investigated. First, the evolution of cooperation in general depends on correlation. Second, the evolution of sociality cannot be fully understood without a dynamical point of view. Third and relatedly, dynamic analyses must go beyond the study of evolutionary equilibria.

The book comprises four parts of varying lengths and coherence. The first part's sole chapter provides a general overview of the evolution of cooperative and fair behaviours, which in all cases stem from some kind of correlation mechanism -- be the explanation based on 'kin selection, group selection, repeated games, spatial interaction, static and dynamic interaction networks' (6). Skyrms focuses on two less immediate points. First, the typically problematic transition from non-cooperative to cooperative equilibria can be explained in many ways: by 'secret handshakes' between cooperative invaders, by local interactions between neighbours or by allowing the interaction structure itself to evolve. Second, negative correlation also matters, as it can lead to the evolution of spite (a behaviour costly both to an individual and to her partner) -- especially in finite populations. Spite is not always detrimental to cooperation though, as one of its forms is costly punishment.

The second part, the most philosophical in the book, is also its longest and most heterogeneous; it provides examples and discussions of Skyrms' dynamical approach. In the Stag Hunt, reinforcement learning and between-group mobility favour cooperation (chap. 2). In bargaining games, local interactions favour fairness (chap. 3). Sometimes general lessons are not available, as the role of a given factor or the evolution of a given behaviour may vary depending on the details of a model: conformist bias may or may not favour cooperation (chap. 5); cooperation may or may not evolve in N-person Stag Hunts (chap. 7). Even if evolutionary or learning models typically involve agents that are strongly cognitively bounded, they are much less frugal than they appear, for cognitively bounded agents can learn to take turns (a problem in non-evolutionary game theory) (chap. 8), and evolutionary considerations can make sense of context-dependent behaviours, either when agents act identically across different situations, or when they act differently in a given situation depending on irrelevant cues (chap. 9). Finally, Skyrms discusses the explanatory significance of evolutionary models, which increases with the type of stability of the underlying equilibria: local stability matters less than global stability, itself less interesting than structural stability (chap. 4). In general, equilibria are much less insightful than attractors (dynamical endpoints) -- however quirky they may be (chap. 6).

The remaining two parts focus more tightly on specific topics. The third, co-authored with Robin Pemantle, is devoted to network formation. Its first chapter summarises the various conclusions drawn in the next three chapters, which 'deliver the goods' (147), that is, provide technical results for the mathematically savvy. Basically, allowing for the interaction structure to evolve (if faster enough than the evolution of strategy choices) allows for cooperation to evolve. But Skyrms' most interesting point is technical: "We find processes with extremely long transient modes, where limiting behaviour [determined analytically] is not a good guide for predicting behavior after thousands of trials [in simulations]" (183). More on that in a moment.

The book's fourth and last part deals with signaling. Three of its five chapters deal with the evolution of signaling systems under reinforcement learning, and provide content already covered in Skyrms' previous book Signals: pooling equilibria, synonyms, invention of new signals, multiple senders and receivers, etc. Signaling systems are likely to evolve in simple cases, but not so when the numbers of signals, senders or receivers increase. Skyrms and co-authors explore modeling options that may help restore this likeliness. (For a discussion of this specific part of Skyrms' work, I refer the reader to my review of Signals in NDPR in 2010.) Two other chapters tackle pre-play signaling, which in classical game theory has no strategic effect, as reflected by its widespread label of 'cheap talk'. In an evolutionary setting though, cheap talk can make cooperation and fairness more likely, and, in finite populations, allows even more surprisingly for cooperation to evolve when interactions are modeled by the Prisoner's Dilemma.

Three decades ago, the first major success of evolutionary game theory, also based on simulations, was to show that cooperative behaviour could receive a simple explanation. Far from being the strongly irrational choice suggested by the Prisoner's Dilemma, cooperation could result from the cognitively undemanding Tit-for-Tat strategy during repeated interactions, which also outcompeted most other strategies, as was made clear during Axelrod's famous tournament (1984). The appearance of cooperation was not impenetrable anymore; it even started looking easy. Years later, as exemplified by Skyrms' work (as well as that of theorists such as Ken Binmore, Peyton Young, Jason McKenzie Alexander), evolutionary simulations of social behaviours still aim at showing how easily social behaviours can evolve.

How does one do that? Skyrms uses multiple models, in which there are variations of the basic games that represent the interactions (Stag Hunt? With what exact payoffs? Bargaining games? Signaling games? With how many players?), of the parameters that rule the agent's cognitive abilities (Learning abilities?), and of the characteristics of the environment (Noisy or not? Static or dynamic?). The ideal would be to show that the behaviour of interest is likely enough to evolve in a wide enough range of possibilities -- in other words, that it is robust enough. Robust results open the door to simple explanations and to general lessons.

Indeed, the book opens with a slogan -- no cooperation without correlation. However, the rest of the book reveals, if not the vanity of similar slogans, at least the dim possibility that there be many simple truths for us to grab in evolutionary game theory. This is because 'evolutionary game theory is full of contingency' (18). Cooperation, fairness and communication can evolve under some conditions but not others; they are promoted by some set of factors and hindered by others. Skyrms tirelessly explores numerous possibly relevant factors, in isolation and combined.

Philosophers may say, it's all very well, but it does not leave much to discuss. Some formal results are obtained; we can only strive to obtain more of them in additional models, under new conditions, with different combinations of factors, in order to deepen our general knowledge. Indeed, I would surmise that almost anyone who has presented game-theoretic models in front of a general philosophical audience has had to face this question: where is the philosophy?

Let me make clear that Social Dynamics is not only a philosophy book. A bit more than half of its chapters have been published in philosophy journals. The others belong to scientific journals and can be difficult (chap. 6-7, 11-12) or probably impossible (chap. 13-14) to follow for one without a strong mathematical education (think Hopf bifurcations, Lyapunov functions, supermartingales, stochastic approximations . . .). Indeed, at one point Skyrms states that 'we hope that our modeling exercise has a significance that is more than purely philosophical' (187), in the sense that it may be informed by empirical data and provide 'building blocks' (xiii) for more complex models. These sections are primarily of interest to modelers. That being said, I see the book as providing at least three different philosophical payoffs, on which I will focus next (rather than on a detailed assessment of Skyrms' numerous results).

First, the book illustrates the various roles played by computer simulations. Typically, they provide how-possibly candidate explanations -- in this case they suggest ways in which a social behaviour of interest may have appeared and stabilised. This entails that simulations can refute previously made impossibility claims (e.g., 'the possibility to invent new signals would make signaling systems less likely to appear and stabilise'). Moreover, some philosophers see simulations as similar to experiments. Indeed, they can reveal surprising phenomena, such as the existence of attractors with strange characteristics (chap. 6) or of pooling equilibria. Even more interestingly, they can provide surprising explanations for known phenomena: that spite is more likely to evolve in small populations (chap. 1), that local interactions favour equal sharing (chap.3), or that pre-play communication may favour the evolution of cooperation and fairness (chap. 16). Simulations can also have a heuristic role, as famously noticed by Maynard Smith (1984) in the case of evolutionary game theory.

Second, the book shows what characteristics of simulations are explanatorily relevant. Skyrms repeatedly emphasises that a dynamical point of view must go beyond equilibrium analysis -- the evolutionary paths that lead to equilibria are equally, if not more, illuminating, and attracting states matter. Even more specifically, convergence states may be irrelevant if the time taken to converge is too long -- for we would never expect to observe them in real systems. 'Simulations may not be a reliable guide to limiting behaviour and limiting behaviour is not all that necessarily is of interest' (155). The technical difficulty of some results is the price to pay for having your dynamics done right.

Computer simulations are often accused of being epistemically opaque -- humans cannot physically check each calculation step. Moreover, even if simulations do not exclude analytical approaches -- they may even pave the way for analytic insights (chap. 2, 15) -- such analyses may be already mathematically challenging in the simplest cases (chap. 14: 315) and possibly out of reach in more general models. However, they can also lead to better explanatory factors. In particular, simulations help reveal the importance of transient properties: either properties that disappear once a final state is reached (e.g., correlation, (cf. p. 11)); or, more interestingly, properties that appear and disappear between the starting and final states of a run. Although difficult to detect analytically, such properties of intermediary states only may be crucial for the occurrence of certain final states, or at least may favour their occurrence. For instance, information transfer, which ultimately explains the positive influence of cheap talk on cooperation (chap. 16), is only detected when running simulations. So simulations can have specific explanatory import, which can also be of heuristic value. (Here, allow me to overlook the well-known idea that for simulations to be explanatory, they have to be considered as adequate representations of the target physical system, and that the problem of defining such adequateness falls to philosophy.)

One may feel that simulations have but weak explanatory virtues, for they seem to be explanatory whether we obtain robust results or not. 'We are particularly interested in results that are robust as parameters and modeling details vary, or, when they are not robust, of understanding how these details of the model affect observed qualitative behavior' (191). If we are explanatorily better off either way, is it all swings and roundabouts then? Not quite. As Skyrms notes, the explanatory import of robustness depends on the parameters with respect to which results are robust. In the absence of robustness, the nitty-gritty details matter, too: one has to shed light on the interplay of various factors and their effects on the behaviour of interest. You do not just run simulations effortlessly; you have to be finicky.

Third, simulations based on simple models are likely to be relevant to the cognitively complex behaviours of interest to philosophers. In philosophy, cooperation and communication are typically intentionally loaded terms -- they involve specific mental states that distinguish them from the crude behavioural ersatz found in evolutionary game theory, and so seem to ask for distinct explanations. However, if the evolution of cooperation or communication is really 'easy' and its explanation highly robust, then our sophisticated cognition would not make a difference -- it would only mimic the function of, or piggyback on more primitive mechanisms. If, on the contrary, such explanations are not robust, then we should expect to make sense of our capacities only with a complex evolutionary story. In all cases, the search for evolutionary explanations through simulations based on simple models is relevant to the study of our (seemingly complex) social cognition.

Analytic philosophy has a long tradition of using formal tools, be it to define concepts, to clarify arguments, to explore the consequences of hypotheses or to investigate the properties of phenomena. Historically, logic has been (and maybe still is) the most widespread formal tool in philosophy. Skyrms' work stands firmly in formal philosophy, but most of it corresponds to a different, increasingly popular approach, namely the appeal to multi-agent simulations. I anticipate and to some extent understand the reluctance of some philosophers when faced with such a book. It is technically challenging -- extremely so in some chapters -- and can be said to be only partly philosophical. But it is rewarding and exemplifies a good way of doing formal philosophy. It sheds light on what evolutionary approaches, especially simulations, can and cannot do for philosophy. But mostly, it highlights the fact that our understanding of social phenomena cannot be complete if we neglect a dynamical point of view.

Rather than a blind exploration of the possibilities opened by countless modeling options, Social Dynamics offers a careful, informed exploration of the relevant ones, as well as discussions of their explanatory import. No one interested in the evolution of sociality should ignore it, if only to know what it takes to carry out a thorough evolutionary investigation. Accordingly, I only expect the simulation train to keep accelerating (consider the recent works of Simon Huttegger, Rory Smead, and Kevin Zollman), surely to the dismay of some. We may not need only books like this in philosophy; but we need some, and we certainly need more of them. And if the recent literature is any indication, we will have them -- in no small part due to Skyrms' remarkable, pioneering work. Fasten your seatbelts; it's going to be a bumpy night.