Social Epistemology and Epistemic Agency: Decentralizing Epistemic Agency

Placeholder book cover

Patrick J. Reider (ed.), Social Epistemology and Epistemic Agency: Decentralizing Epistemic Agency, Rowman and Littlefield, 2016, 182pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781783483471.

Reviewed by  Edward S. Hinchman, Florida State University


Most philosophers agree that the world contains epistemic subjects, the subjects of knowledge claims and other epistemic assessments. But does the world contain specifically epistemic agents? We talk as if epistemic subjects are agents -- 'His belief is irresponsible,' 'She ought to have known' -- but may on reflection wonder whether we should take the talk at face value. Are you responsible for your beliefs in anything like the way you are responsible for your actions? Does failing to know impugn your character in a way that parallels your failure to act with practical wisdom? Affirmative answers may emerge from reflection on the social dimension of knowing: from how you may come to know through others' testimony or let others know in turn. Can we make sense of such epistemic community without attributing specifically epistemic agency to its participants? Flipping our opening question on its head, should the social provenance of epistemic agency affect how we conceptualize the nature of epistemic subjects?

The present collection is built from two programmatic 'anchor' essays, by Sanford Goldberg ("A Proposed Research Program for Social Epistemology") and Steve Fuller ("A Sense of Epistemic Agency Fit for Social Epistemology"), each of which articulates a distinctive way in which the social dimension of epistemic agency 'decentralizes' epistemic subjecthood. In the jargon of the book's subtitle, as explained by its editor, a "decentralizing" epistemic agency would "diffuse" epistemic responsibility across the epistemic community rather than localizing it in the individual subject (ix). The anchor essays differ in how they approach the issue, Roughly put, Goldberg proposes a framework for determining whether epistemic agency decentralizes, whereas Fuller proposes a framework for explaining how it does. Both essays emphasize the social nature of epistemic responsibility -- not merely that we hold others to epistemic norms but that the norms themselves enforce a species of responsibility that is itself social in nature: a responsibility not merely enforced by others but constituted by our relations to others. Goldberg focuses on how we depend on others to live up to epistemically productive normative expectations -- not merely to the expectation that the other will prove knowledgeable, grounded in our evidence that they will, but also to our expecting this of them in a way grounded by norms that are not straightforwardly evidential but emerge more complexly within forms of shared epistemic community. Fuller focuses less on the provenance of epistemic responsibility and more on its socially articulate structure, arguing for an interpretation of epistemic agency in terms of interpersonal liability rather than self-ownership. For reasons of space, I'll mostly discuss Goldberg's contribution and the essays that reply to it, though I'll describe an important aspect of Fuller's contribution toward the end. Both authors have written much in social epistemology, and their anchor essays allude to these broader arguments. I'll restrict my discussion here to the core elements in each author's view, as presented in the anchor essays.

Let me first offer a broad worry about how the book situates these questions about epistemic agency within the broader literature. In his editorial Introduction, Patrick Reider claims that "most analytic philosophers working in this field" -- social epistemology -- "support traditional individual-focused conceptions of truth," which Reider glosses as the broad thesis that "knowledge, despite significant social contributions, irreducibly concerns objective states of existence that are, in theory, distinguishable from social influence ". "Such conceptions," he continues, "can foster the idea that the social dimension of knowledge is superfluous once knowledge of existence is obtained" (xii). Though Reider identifies Goldberg as falling into this camp, Goldberg does not appear to meet the terms that define it. And stigmatizing 'most analytic philosophers' as (possibly self-deceived) 'individualists' is fundamentally misleading.

Reider's quoted description appears to ascribe to 'analytic' philosophers a theoretical commitment to the claim that an adequate account of the nature of knowledge need make no appeal to social relations. But there are influential 'analytic' philosophers who have argued explicitly against this claim. Edward Craig, for example, argued nearly thirty years ago that the point of the concept of knowledge lies in how it enables us to pick out 'informants,' by which Craig meant people who, in knowing whether p, can enable others to know that p on the basis of their testimony.[1] Craig's work did not become influential till about fifteen years ago, but since then many 'analytic' philosophers have attested to its influence.[2] In similar fashion, 'analytic' philosophers who emphasize the role of trust in the social articulation of knowledge -- for example, Paul Faulkner, who is represented in the present volume (see below) -- argue that an addressee's trust can itself, and just as such, constitute an epistemic reason to believe the trusted's testimony, which entails a view of epistemic rationality that puts social relations right at its core. Goldberg does not appear to go this far. He argues that social epistemology ought to treat as it as "an open question whether the solitary epistemic subject is the only proper unit of analysis at which to conduct epistemic assessment" (9). This question would appear not be open if it were settled that you could have an epistemic reason grounded in your trust, since a full analysis of this reason could not view you as solitary. (There is, however, room for confusion over what we mean by a 'unit' of analysis. We ascribe the reason to the solitary subject, but we explain what grounds that ascription by viewing the subject in relation.) Still, there is no indication that Goldberg views this question as likely to be resolved in the negative -- as there would be if he counted as a typical 'analytic' philosopher on Reider's description.

What is distinctive in Goldberg's proposal lies in his account of the perspective from which epistemic agency is exercised. There are three importantly different perspectives to consider: (a) the perspective of the one ascribing knowledge, (b) the perspective of the one presumed to know prior to the present instance of sociality, and (c) the perspective of the one who comes to know through the latter's social influence. There is nothing 'decentering' about (a). While an emphasis on the role of ascribers may serve to explain the nature of epistemic responsibility (as it does in Strawsonian explanations of moral responsibility), that wouldn't show that epistemic subjects are anything but solitary in the sense presently at issue. The real issue emerges when we ask which is prior as between (b) and (c). Goldberg argues for (b). In his contribution to the present volume, "Agency and Disagreement," Paul Faulkner argues for (c). Since it is not clear to what extent they disagree and to what extent Goldberg and Faulkner are talking past one another insofar as they emphasize these different perspectives, the issue between them reveals one respect in which social epistemology can diagnose potential confusions in our talk of epistemic agency.

Goldberg frames his proposal as targeting "the epistemic significance of other minds" and argues that the significance lies in how some of our normative expectations of one another manifest a shared grasp on the norms that shape our common epistemic community. The key for Goldberg, emphasizing perspective (b), lies in how these norms govern someone on whom we may depend for knowledge. This species of normative governance applies to a subject conceived as the target of others' normative expectations, expectations grounded in the terms of this transaction or species of influence. But what of the subject on the other side of the transaction? What of the one who would undergo the influence? As Faulkner argues, emphasizing perspective (c), this subject manifests agency through making a choice. Assuming the influence unfolds through testimony, the audience can (i) take the speaker's testimony as a piece of evidence or (ii) simply believe the speaker. As audience, one may acknowledge that both options are available, but it seems that one cannot have it both ways: in believing the speaker, in taking the speaker's word, one does not treat the speaker's testimony as a mere piece of evidence -- at least, there is a distinction between two normative stances that one may take toward the speaker that we may express by using the term 'evidence' in this way. (Nothing turns on the possibility that in believing a speaker one may treat her testimony as evidence. If one believes the speaker, then one does not treat her testimony as a mere piece of evidence -- to be weighed against other evidence in one's possession and only then declared sufficient for belief.)

Faulkner argues that one thus manifests one's agency as audience by choosing between two directives, 'Be epistemically autonomous!' or 'Trust!' He argues that the choice has an important implication for your entitlement to persist in your belief when confronting disagreement: reasonable persistence requires an aim at epistemic autonomy that is not promoted by trust. But his principal conclusion concerns the nature of epistemic agency itself: that it is responsive to such potentially divergent directives. Though he doesn't discuss this dialectic, Faulkner thereby offers a compelling response to Kieran Setiya's principal worry about the possibility of epistemic agency.[3] Though one is in some sense active in forming the belief that p for epistemic reasons R, Setiya argues, the idea that one is an epistemic agent in believing for reasons presupposes that one can mark a distinction within one's total epistemic reasons for p between those that serve as the ground of one's belief and those that do not. Similarly, when one performs an action j for reasons, one can distinguish those reasons from other reasons, on which one is not acting, that one nonetheless believes are reasons that one has to j. (An example: I'm about to eat from politeness but then realize that I'm actually hungry and so thankfully will not have to eat from politeness, though I continue to believe that politeness gives me a reason to eat.)

Can one distinguish one's reasons for believing that p from the totality of reasons that one believes one has to believe that p? Setiya argues that one cannot, but Faulkner appears to have identified a way to make the distinction effective. Say one believes that p by believing the speaker, but one nonetheless believes that one could have reasonably believed that p on the basis of evidence given by the speaker's testimony, without believing the speaker. Here one's believing that p for reasons R does not reduce to one's belief that p plus one's belief that one has R. Just as in practical agency, we must say more, and more specifically about how one has chosen to believe, in order to explain how one's epistemic activity responds to reasons -- a gap that seems to call for the ascription of something like self-governance.

Switching back to the perspective Goldberg emphasizes, that of the subject whose agency figures in the provision of knowledge rather than in its reception, Fred D'Agostino's essay ("Disciplines, the Division of Epistemic Labor, and Agency") offers an account of disciplinary agency in terms of goods internal to epistemic practices (in Alasdair MacIntyre's sense) articulated through a division of epistemic labor. On the received view of such disciplinary agency, agents pursue the more-or-less external value of esteem -- not, perhaps, as a primary motive but as a secondary motive that reliably kicks in when primary motives fail. D'Agostino first considers how the received view might cope with the puzzle that disesteemed agents are not thereby deterred from participating in disciplinary practice, then proposes an alternative explanation in terms of more purely internal values bestowed not through reputation but through recognition. This model of agents as practitioners rather than seekers of celebrity better explains the lived experience of disciplinary agents and can explain why lack of esteem is no barrier to participation, since the recognition of excellence in pursuing internal goods is, unlike esteem, not implicitly comparative.

Two essays criticize Goldberg for failing to go deep enough in his approach to the social nature of epistemic agency. In "'Epistemic Agency': A Hegelian Perspective," Angelica Nuzzo argues that we cannot understand what it is for the exercise of agency to be at once both epistemic, rather than practical, and social, rather than individual, without revisiting the transition within German idealism from Kant's and Fichte's transcendental subject to the more properly epistemic agent that Hegel theorizes as 'spirit' in its dialectical constitution -- a transition wherein Hegel "turn[s] away from subjectivity tout court in order to concentrate on the immanent unfolding of the process or the action itself" (152). Patrick Reider's "Epistemic Agency as a Social Achievement: Rorty, Putnam, and Neo-German Idealism" pursues a parallel argument with updated rhetoric: epistemic agency is more deeply social than Goldberg's account acknowledge, since Goldberg fails to examine the conceptual normativity manifested by the "social achievement of judgment" (174). While it seems true that Goldberg has no developed view of subjectivity or judgment, I fail to see how the observation constitutes a legitimate criticism either of Goldberg or of the 'analytic' approach he supposedly represents. There is, after all, much recent 'analytic' discussion of the normativity of meaning and concepts (by, for example, Allan Gibbard[4] and Hannah Ginsborg[5]) that emphasizes the social articulation of norms informing -- or, if you prefer, constituting -- doxastic judgment. That Goldberg has not (to my knowledge) contributed to these discussions would be a problem only if his approach were somehow incompatible with taking this social dimension of judgment seriously, which it does not appear to be.

Returning to Goldberg's "open question whether the solitary epistemic subject is the only proper unit" of epistemic analysis, Orestis Palermos and Duncan Pritchard ("The Distribution of Epistemic Agency") answer in the negative, elaborating the account of 'extended knowledge' that the authors have proposed in other work. 'Extended knowledge' combines an epistemological thesis, virtue reliabilism, with a thesis in the philosophy of mind, 'active externalism' (by contrast with the passive externalism proposed by Putnam and Burge), assigning the 'epistemic sensibility' that Goldberg posits at the core of epistemic subjecthood a 'distributed' and therefore more deeply social nature. If we accept that there is such extended knowledge, we blur the distinction between perspectives that informed my contrast between Goldberg's and Faulkner's approaches: it is through the virtue of the group, manifested in a collective belief-forming process, that the proposition is known, whether by the one who provides the knowledge or by the one to whom it is provided. Though a testifier may be, as it were, proximately responsible for a provision of knowledge, it is the collectivity whose virtue is thereby manifested that is ultimately responsible. This distinction will typically not, it seems, be reflected in the audience's normative expectations of the speaker. Palermos and Pritchard concede that their approach may prove an alternative to rather than an extension of Goldberg's, but the approaches seem in this respect incompatible. Though Goldberg has defended a 'distributed' conception of epistemic agency in other work,[6] his emphasis on normative expectations does not appear compatible with Palermos and Pritchard's conception of 'distribution.'

Even if we agree that knowledge is 'extended' or 'distributed,' therefore, we may disagree about exactly how. Let me now turn briefly to Steve Fuller's anchor essay, which articulates a very different conception of how knowledge is extended through social relations. Fuller defends what he calls a "liability model" of agency which, as he puts it, "makes one's own de facto agency depend on possibilities that are opened or closed by the presence of other agents" (25). On the liability model, a testifier's epistemic responsibility to be credible is 'distributed' in a way that includes the addressee's responsibility not to be credulous: the normative status of neither status can be simply 'owned' as if it were property. Though Fuller does not frame it thus, his approach appears to trade on the idea that epistemic normativity is not monadic but bipolar (in something like Michael Thompson's sense[7]) or multipolar (in an extension of Thompson's sense) -- not a matter of right and wrong simpliciter, as assessed by others, but a more complex matter of doing justice to others, through networks of mutually co-conditioned responsibility. Though Fuller's conception of normativity is broadly consequentialist -- he defines a 'normative' approach as "one committed to organizing the means available to bring about or maintain some desirable state of affairs" (21) -- his conception of sociality is thus anti-monadic: it is not so much that there are collective subjects as that epistemic subjecthood rests on an irreducibly collective species of normativity.

The remaining three essays contrast Fuller's approach with the approach that they attribute to 'analytic social epistemology' -- thereby promulgating some of the caricatures of the latter that I noted earlier. Finn Collin's "Two Kinds of Social Epistemology and the Foundations of Epistemic Agency" offers a systematic overview of the differences between Goldberg's and Fuller's approaches. In their more polemical "Fuller's Social Epistemology and Epistemic Agency," Francis Remedios and R. Valentine Dusek contrast Fuller's 'agent-oriented' approach to expertise with the 'object-oriented' approach that they claim is "aligned" (61) with analytic social epistemology, arguing that the latter treats our epistemic relation to experts as problematically passive. In "Toward Fluid Epistemic Agency," Frank Scalambrino contrasts a 'fluid' species of agency that he argues constitutes the distinctive element in human epistemic subjecthood with a non-fluid species characteristic of non-human corporate subjects, defining the former species partly in terms of the risk that it runs of being oppressed by exercises of the latter species. Like the other three authors, Scalambrino argues that Fuller offers helpful tools for diagnosing and correcting the anti-agential tendencies inherent in 'analytic' approaches to social epistemology, whether those tendencies emerge through an unacknowledged individualism or through a failure to get the concept of agency properly in view.

Again, I worry about the needless antagonism in the idea that 'analytic' approaches are somehow entrenched in opposition to genuine agency or sociality. The broadest philosophical questions at issue here are twofold: How exactly should the concepts of agency and sociality inform a properly epistemological investigation? And how should such an investigation draw on work in other areas of philosophy? We cannot understand epistemic agency without understanding practical agency, and we cannot understand epistemic agency without understanding the agential elements in judgment, belief and the normativity of concepts. But no epistemologist should try to theorize all these matters at once.

[1] Knowledge and the State of Nature (Oxford University Press, 1990).

[2] For example, Miranda Fricker in Epistemic Injustice (Oxford University Press, 2007).

[3] “Epistemic Agency: Some Doubts,” Philosophical Perspectives 23 (2013), 179-198.

[4] Meaning and Normativity (Oxford University Press, 2012).

[5] Most recently, “Normativity and Concepts,” in D. Star (ed.), The Oxford Handbook of Reasons and Normativity (Oxford University Press, 2018).

[6] Relying on Others (Oxford University Press, 2010).

[7] “What is it to Wrong Someone? A Puzzle about Justice,” in R. J. Wallace, P. Pettit, S. Scheffler, and M. Smith (eds.), Reason and Value: Themes from the Moral Philosophy of Joseph Raz (Oxford University Press, 2004).  Thompson does not, in this essay, extend this species of justice to epistemic normativity.