Social Epistemology and Technology: Toward Public Self-Awareness Regarding Technological Mediation

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Frank Scalambrino (ed.), Social Epistemology and Technology: Toward Public Self-Awareness Regarding Technological Mediation, Rowman and Littlefield, 2016, 238pp., $39.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781783485338.

Reviewed by Shannon Vallor, Santa Clara University


This anthology draws together eighteen essays under the umbrella of the concept of technological mediation -- that is, the rich variety of ways in which technology conditions (and is conditioned by) human sociality, subjectivity, knowledge production, power relations, values, and norms. This concept is well-known to most scholars working in the loose disciplinary cluster that includes STS (Science and Technology Studies), sociology of knowledge, philosophy of technology, and critical theory and media studies. Indeed, this cluster reflects the research orientations of most of the contributors.

The title of the collection promises that it will develop a particular thematic aspect of technological mediation, namely, its relationship to public self-awareness, which the editor's introduction characterizes as referring "not only to a publicly accessible dimension of social knowledge to which we may contribute but also to a domain in the service of freedom" (5). As the introduction makes clear, the interest that motivates this book's theme is explicitly normative: how should a public understand and manage its own relation to the social knowledge that it collectively produces and employs, and technology's role in mediating that relation? This is an enticing and important question. As the rise of so-called 'post-factual democracies'[1] powerfully conditioned by new media threatens to undermine both global political stability and well-informed policy, our interest in understanding the sociotechnical paths by which 'public understanding' is constructed has never been more vital.

Unfortunately, the promise of this guiding theme is left largely unfulfilled by a disparate collection of chapters that only rarely appear to be asking or answering the same question, and that show marked variability in both quality and relevance to the collection's stated focus. A reader with a compelling interest in the book's theme will find many valuable insights, but will have to work a bit harder than she should to uncover them. Part of the difficulty is rooted in the book's structure; for reasons that are never fully made clear by the editor, the chapters are sharply divided into two sections: Part I, "Normative Dimensions of Technological Mediation and Public Self-Awareness," and Part II, "Exploring Changing Conceptions of Humans and Humanity." As the titles suggest, only the first grouping bears a clear relation to the book's stated focus, and the lack of thematic cohesion in Part II is striking, despite some quality contributions in the mix.

The contributions in Part I that do the most to elucidate the book's theme include Steve Fuller's 'The Place of Value in a World of Information,' Hans Radder's 'Technological Systems and Genuine Public Interests,' and Jamie Carlin Watson's 'Filter Bubbles and the Public Use of Reason: Applying Epistemology to the Newsfeed.' Fuller explores how the public sphere and our understanding of 'public value' has been reshaped by the emergence of platform capitalism: a system in which information-communication platforms such as Google and Facebook mediate the production of metapublic goods data-mined from our voluntary use of those platforms (22). He identifies this as a new form of economic exploitation and 'cyber-enclosure' that increasingly expropriates from the public not our physical labor or our land, but our possibilities (24). While Fuller offers no constructive remedy other than a vague closing reference to the prospect of enfranchising 'digital prosumers' able to invest our own data capital (26), the contribution opens up a number of interesting questions about the relationship between public self-awareness, economic power and large technological systems.

Radder builds nicely upon this beginning by showing how understanding the distinctive mediating function of large technological systems (LTS) can help us to substantiate and become more aware of the robust existence of public interests. He argues convincingly that the way in which an LTS functions as a resistant "material and social inheritance" with which all persons must cope undermines individualist-liberalist pretensions to unconstrained freedom and autonomy as regulative ideals, and also constitutes genuine supra-individual interests (31).

In the fourth chapter, Watson explores the implications for agents' epistemic responsibility of Eli Pariser's notion of 'filter bubbles' produced by personalized search algorithms and data-mining, arguing that the invisibility, scale and coercive power of such mechanisms constrain the evidence-gathering behavior of the public in ways that compromise our epistemic responsibility without us knowing it (54), amounting to an indirect form of censorship in the public sphere (55). Here the volume's intended target -- the relationship between technological mediation, public self-awareness and social knowledge -- is directly in Watson's crosshairs, even if, as with most of the chapters, not much is offered in the way of a constructive response to the profound normative challenges being identified.

Other chapters in Part I aim at the target more obliquely. Daniel J. Brunson's discussion of 'The End of Trust in the Age of Big Data?' explores two accounts of trust (the 'goodwill' and 'risk-assessment' views). But he never draws any robust conclusions about how public trust and knowledge are shaped in the era of Big Data other than to ask whether algorithmic agents are appropriate candidates for trust (44). Elize de Mul's discussion of existential 'boundary regulation' in the context of 'selfies' aims to draw conclusions about "new types of privacy" generated by new technologies (77), but it never quite becomes clear what these new types of privacy are, or how they relate to our public self-awareness or social knowledge. Stephen M. Bourque ('Critical Media') reviews foundational literature in critical media studies and 'media archaeology' while indicating only in the most general ways its implications for social epistemology. William Davis' chapter calls for 'undisciplined' philosophers of technology, that is, those outside of academia, to shape public discussions and anticipatory governance of technology. Yet it leaves unstated what distinguishes an 'undisciplined philosopher' from any other member of the lay public interested in technology, or how this proposal improves upon existing calls for academic philosophers to engage public audiences more effectively.

Part II's disparate selections lead off with Charles Bambach's exposition of Heidegger's philosophy of technology, which, though clear and well-grounded in the texts, makes no clear connection to the book's themes. Likewise with Arthur Kok's comparison of Kant and Marx on instrumental reason and the division of intellectual and physical labor. Danielle Guizzo's 'The Biopolitics of the Female' offers a helpful account of the technological mediation of power over female bodies and behavior, but says little about the precise ways in which this mediation shapes social knowledge, or public self-awareness specifically. Other chapters offer richer possibilities for connection, such as Joris Vlieghe's excellent contribution on the epistemic import of the shift from traditional to digital literacy, and the way in which this shift engenders a newly exteriorized sense of the space of language and the subject's orientation to its production (135). While the specific implications of this shift for public-self awareness and social knowledge remain largely unstated, the potential value of the inquiry to the book's project is evident.

Among the best contributions to Part II and to the volume, both in terms of clarity and relevance, is Chris Drain and Richard Charles Strong's 'Situated Mediation and Technological Reflexivity.' Their focused and concise analysis links the already-familiar characterization of smartphones as mediators and extenders of memory and cognition to the social construction of the self and collective remembrance. As they note, smartphones enable and enhance both individual and collective memory, and hence knowledge, but also risk epistemic overconfidence (193). Moreover, they can induce a qualitative leveling and de-specification of embodied selves and the informational and physical environments we navigate with them (192). The chapter provokes the reader to ask how social knowledge and public self-awareness constructed from such enhanced but de-specified experiences and memories might be simultaneously empowered and impoverished.

One striking difference in quality among the contributions is the extent to which they acknowledge and engage with concrete forms of technological mediation, as expressed in particular technosocial configurations and contexts. While many chapters have a quite specific focus, such as Mindaugas Briedis's phenomenological analysis of radiological imaging and Levi Checketts' Levinasian critique of facial recognition technology, other chapters suffer from excessively abstract and ungrounded characterizations of technology, of the sort that was common in late 20th century scholarship but has been widely eschewed since the "empirical turn" in 21st century philosophy of technology and technology studies.

For example, Patrick J. Reider's contribution to Part I, 'The Internet and Existentialism,' makes the mistake of resting on sweeping claims about "internet culture" (65) as a singular, uniform phenomenon. He asserts in blanket fashion that online, "one can typically post whatever one wishes without repercussions," (61) and that "epistemic incompetency must surely follow" from a culture of on-demand media (62), claims which fail to withstand even casual empirical scrutiny. Likewise, while Chad Engelland's reflections in Part II on presence and absence to others in a world of digital connections offer some good insights about what kinds of presence are and are not easily shared within different kinds of technologically mediated connections (email, texting, video, letters, phone), these later collapse into an indiscriminate diagnosis of the universal subject of technology, the unspecified 'we' who Engelland tells us "do not have much to say, since our own habit of communication and thus thinking has been fashioned by the short bursts of texts and images that fill social media" (172). One clear advance in the philosophy of technology in recent decades is to recognize the important differences among human subjects of technological mediation, the rich variety of technologies and forms of mediation to which they are subject, and the diverse ways in which different subjects respond to such mediations. It makes the work of theorizing more challenging, to be sure, but it remains important to resist the temptation to characterize technology, or even the internet, as a singular force having a global effect on an undifferentiated public. At a minimum, the more general the proclamation about technosocial effects on 'humans today,' the greater the burden on the author to support those claims and defend their breadth from challenge.

A final note: a few chapters rely on sociological or philosophical jargon of the sort that tends to obscure more than it reveals. Scholars already working within the disciplinary cluster described at the start of this review will generally be able to make their way through the thicket of specialized terms of references in these selections, and most of the contributions offer plenty of clarity. However, a reader coming to this volume from another disciplinary orientation will sometimes be at sea. For example, Scalambrino's concluding chapter, 'The Vanishing Subject,' had the potential to do the volume a great service by tying together the disparate themes of Part II in a way that clarifies their relation to Part I and to the book's focus. Instead, mirroring similar obscurities in his contribution at the end of Part I, the final chapter is a puzzling stew of ruminations on 'thought memes,' eugenics, and social media by way of Deleuze, Jünger, and Marcel, with opaque critiques of psychoanalysis and 'applied cybernetics' further muddying the waters. While there may be rich material here for thought, the editor's chosen style is a missed opportunity to make the discourses within the STS/media studies/social epistemology cluster more transparent to those outside of it who may nevertheless have overlapping interests in the important questions posed in this volume.

[1] The term ‘post-factual democracy’ was coined by Nicholas Barrett in a widely-shared June 26, 2016 Financial Times article on the Brexit vote.