Social Equality: On What It Means to Be Equals

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Carina Fourie, Fabian Schuppert, and Ivo Wallimann-Helmer (eds.), Social Equality: On What It Means to Be Equals, Oxford University Press, 2015, 242pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199331109.

Reviewed by Ian Carter, University of Pavia


Recent developments in egalitarian thought have included a surge of interest in social or relational equality, a notion that is supposed to capture the idea of individuals living together as equals or relating on equal terms. Advocates of this social or relational ideal have often been keen to contrast it with distributive egalitarianism -- the view that individuals ought to be accorded equal amounts of some good, such as welfare, resources or freedom. Social egalitarians focus on the avoidance of dominating, oppressive or exploitative relations and on the ideal of equal normative status rather than on the goal of giving individuals equal amounts of something. Many of them have indeed criticized the so-called distributive paradigm, which dominated the literature on equality in the final decades of the last century (the so-called equality of what debate), not only for its neglect of relational issues but also for failing to see that egalitarian distributions of personal goods matter only because, or to the extent that, they affect the ways in which persons relate to one another (in more or less dominating, oppressive or exploitative ways). Relational equality is what ultimately matters; distributive equality matters only to the extent that it fosters egalitarian relations.

Many of the contributors to Social Equality belong in this 'social egalitarian' camp. The aim of the volume, however, is to move on from the polemical critique of distributive egalitarianism and to clarify the ideal of social equality by addressing questions such as the following: What, exactly, do egalitarian relations consist in? How is the notion of social equality to be defined, and what would it mean to live together as equals? How, if at all, do socially egalitarian relations differ from politically egalitarian ones? And how is the ideal of social equality related to that of justice? This positive approach is refreshing, for the contrast between social and distributive equality has often been overstated, turning distributive egalitarians into straw men: as the editors and some of the authors in this volume admit, one way to understand notions like that of relating on equal terms is by reference to norms concerning the distribution of social goods like power or authority or wealth, and there is nothing new in the attempt to justify egalitarian distributions of certain social or economic benefits in terms of more basic relational requirements such as that of equal respect.

The volume begins with a forward by David Miller, whose seminal contribution to the analysis of social equality is cited as a starting point in a number of the essays. The forward is followed by a general introduction by the three editors. The collection of ten essays is divided into two parts. The first part focuses on the very idea of social equality. The main concern of these essays is to explicate the concept of social equality and to compare or contrast it with those of distributive equality (Samuel Scheffler), non-domination (Marie Garrau and Cécile Laborde), and equality of esteem or respect or concern (Carina Fourie, Fabian Schuppert, Scheffler and John Baker). The second part concerns the relations between social equality, on the one hand, and justice and politics on the other. Does justice require social equality (Christian Schemmel) or do the requirements of social equality go beyond those of justice (Andrew Mason)? Does the notion of justice include a presumption of equality (Stefan Gosepath)? In the final two essays in this second part, respectively by Rekha Nath and Jonathan Wolff, two political questions are raised. First, how is the ideal of social equality affected by political borders? Must social egalitarians be anti-cosmopolitan egalitarians? After all, our relations with many foreigners are nowhere near as central to our lives as are those with our compatriots or closer associates. Second, what kinds of public policies are implied by the ideal of social equality? The volume's division into two parts is clear enough, but should not be taken too seriously: for example, the essays by Wolff and Gosepath would probably sit just as well in the first part, and the political implications of social equality are addressed no less extensively in several of the essays in the first part (notably, in Garrau and Laborde, and in Baker). I will not try to discuss all of the essays here, but will concentrate on a few general themes and, in the process, highlight a few points made by individual authors.

Given the subtitle of the volume -- On What It Means to Be Equals -- as well as the title of Schuppert's essay -- 'Being Equals' -- it is important to bear in mind that the notion on which the authors focus is, for the most part, that of equal social status, and not the normatively grounding notion of equal moral status that has come to be called basic equality. Individuals might be said to 'be' equals in either of these two senses: first, in the sense of possessing certain morally relevant features equally (basic equality), on the basis of which we say that they ought to interact in certain ways; second, in the sense of possessing an equal social status in virtue of norms prescribing that people interact in those ways. The second sense of being equals is normally thought to be grounded in some way in the first, the idea being that it is only because we are equals in some sense that it is morally appropriate for us to view and to treat each other as equals. The more basic sense of being equals is investigated in another recent collection on equality: Uwe Steinhoff (ed.), Do All Persons Have Equal Moral Worth? (Oxford, 2015). In Social Equality, by contrast, the basic equality of persons, or of citizens, is for the most part taken as given. This said, the assumption of basic equality is made explicit in places (for example, in Mason's piece). Moreover, the essay by Gosepath aims to throw light on the foundations of social or distributive equality in a way that might well be interpreted as contributing to the clarification of basic equality. Gosepath's primary aim is to explain why justice entails a presumption of equality -- the idea that, in the absence of morally relevant criteria for distinguishing between competing claims, the claims of different individuals should be given equal weight.

What, then, is social equality? At first glance, the notion appears to be more difficult to define than that of distributive equality. As Wolff points out, social egalitarians find it much easier to say what social equality is not than to say what it is: we all know that social equality is absent when people enter into asymmetrical relations such as those of domination or exploitation. Perhaps then, as he suggests, we should be content to focus only on the nature of social inequality and dispense with the task of defining social equality except to say that it consists in the absence of the above kinds of asymmetrical relations and that there are many alternative ways of eliminating or minimizing such relations (social equality is not really a single thing but is a multiply realizable phenomenon). As Wolff also suggests, echoing Amartya Sen, the more ambitious task of picturing a world of social equals might be criticized as amounting to a superfluous quest for an ideal theory of justice in a world where it suffices to identify and correct grave injustice.

Baker, by contrast, does not shy from the challenge of presenting a positive reconstruction of the ideal of social equality. In his view, we can spell out the notion of social equality by picturing relations that realize all of the following three desiderata: first, mutual respect and recognition; second, love, care, and solidarity; third, a willingness to cooperate rather than to exercise social power. Baker's enterprise certainly has a strongly utopian flavor, but there does not seem to be anything conceptually amiss in his attempt to spell out the ideal of social equality. A multiply realizable phenomenon is necessarily a relatively abstract and general one, but it is no less unitary for that. Neither need a positive concept of social equality amount to a full-blown theory of justice.

A more procedural positive account of social equality is provided by Scheffler, who first examines the nature of egalitarian personal relationships (such as a friendship or an egalitarian marriage) and then goes on to consider the more politically relevant relational ideal of a society of equals. A central characteristic of all such relationships, Scheffler suggests, is the fact that each of the parties respects an egalitarian deliberative constraint which is to say that they take certain decisions in a way that assigns an equally significant role to each person's needs, values and preferences. As Scheffler notes, the kind of behavior prescribed by this deliberative constraint will depend very much on which decisional issues count as internal to a given relationship and which as external to it. This fact illustrates another of Scheffler's central points: that an adequate explication of the notion of social equality must appeal to a number of values other than that of equality. The notion of social equality is therefore a complex one.

Is the notion of social equality more complex than that of distributive equality? Scheffler thinks so. After all, he suggests, distributive equality is merely the assignment of an equal amount of some good, and the only other value to be appealed to is that of the good to be distributed. I found this last aspect of Scheffler's analysis less convincing than his positive account of social equality. Any normatively adequate characterization of distributive equality must include a plausible account of its currency, its scope, and its site, and the resolution of these issues must depend in turn on how we characterize basic equality, on what, exactly, it means to show respect or concern for people who are so characterized as basically equal, on the difference between personhood and citizenship, and so on. Distributive equality does not seem to me to be a 'normatively autonomous value' (p. 41), any more than social equality seems to be.

Several of the authors tackle the difficult problem of distinguishing between acceptable and unacceptable hierarchical relations. On the face of it, social egalitarians ought to be opposed to hierarchical relations. However, it is surely both impossible and undesirable to eliminate all hierarchical relations in a modern society. Any such society inevitably contains positions of political and administrative authority, leaders and followers, winners and losers. And most of us agree that it would be foolhardy in many situations not to defer to relevant epistemic authorities. If the ideal of social equality is not to appear deeply unattractive, then the egalitarian must say which kinds of hierarchical relations are morally objectionable and which are not and why.

One fairly standard way of addressing this problem is by distinguishing between respect and esteem. Respect, here, is taken to mean the recognition of certain basic moral capacities in other people, whereas esteem is taken to imply the appraisal of other people's choices or of certain other features that do not bear on their status as a moral person (for example, their beauty or knowledgeableness). Inequalities of esteem are an inevitable part of social life and are compatible with equal respect. On this standard egalitarian view, then, the ideal of social equality implies equality of respect but tolerates or even encourages hierarchies of esteem in terms of beauty, knowledge, professional achievement, and so on.

In contrast to this view, both Fourie and Schuppert argue that inequalities of esteem can be problematic for social egalitarians because they can provoke feelings of inferiority that are damaging to individuals' sense of self-worth or self-respect. Social egalitarians therefore require more fine-grained distinctions between acceptable and unacceptable hierarchies of esteem. Fourie helpfully provides a tentative taxonomy of the conditions of unacceptability, which includes the following points: esteem hierarchies amount to unacceptable social inequalities when the esteem is accorded for the wrong reasons, when the hierarchies receive certain kinds of institutional backing, when they are the result of unequal opportunities for esteem (for example, where women's only opportunities to gain the esteem of others are as mothers or cooks or beauty queens), or when the number of dimensions along which people can seek to win others' esteem is rather limited. This last point, which draws on the work of Thomas Scanlon and is echoed in the contributions of Schuppert and Schemmel, has the interesting implication that genuine social equality may require value pluralism.

Overall, this volume has the important merit of providing a clearer vision -- or rather, set of visions -- of what social equality amounts to, both in theory and in practice. It also leaves open a number of questions, implicitly suggesting directions for further research. In particular, it seems to me that there is still room for progress in clarifying the distinction between social equality and distributive equality -- a distinction that is tackled head on only in Scheffler's essay. One might of course reject the idea that these two notions are clearly or wholly distinct. After all, it is difficult to conceive of people living together as equals without also conceiving, even if only implicitly, of some good-making aspect of their lives that they, or others, have rendered equal -- a more or less abstract good the equal possession of which is a grounding property in virtue of which the relation of social equality exists. However, the presumed distinctness of social and distributive equality does seem to be doing normative work throughout the book and is unavoidable if one follows Mason in thinking of distributive equality (the elimination of certain disadvantages) as an element of justice and of social equality as an ideal that reaches beyond questions of justice.

Wherever the reader's sympathies may lie, Social Equality contains many incisive and stimulating contributions. I therefore recommend it to anyone interested in egalitarianism, and especially to those wishing to get a better grip on the slippery notion of relating as equals.