Social Facts & Collective Intentionality

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Meggle, Georg (ed.), Social Facts & Collective Intentionality, Dr. Hansel-Hohenhausen AG, 2002, 478pp, 112 euros (hbk), ISBN 3826700287.

Reviewed by Ingvar Johansson, Institute for Formal Ontology and Medical Information Science, Leipzig


The anthology Social Facts & Collective Intentionality contains twenty-three papers by twenty-one authors who approach and discuss philosophical problems connected to the topics stated in the title. Within analytic philosophy, there are in particular three books that have played a major role in shaping the philosophy of social facts: Margaret Gilbert, On Social Facts (1989), Raimo Tuomela, The Importance of Us (1995), and John Searle, The Construction of Social Reality (1995). Gilbert and Tuomela have written two papers each in the volume to be reviewed; Searle is present only in spirit.

1. Introduction

How to find order in a book where the papers are arranged only by the names of the authors, and where the editor, Georg Meggle, himself a leading figure in the field of social philosophy, says that he has “not managed to introduce a sense of order into the papers”? According to Meggle, this fact merely reflects “the state of the art.” However, since I need a map, I will impose an order that captures at least some facets of this confusing state.

First, I will put old-fashioned social holism as represented by nineteenth-century German and British idealism (Fichte, Schelling, Hegel; and Bradley, Bosanquet, respectively) in the middle of the map. Second, I will draw three circles around it. The outermost circle represents the view of old-fashioned social atomism according to which social facts are aggregates of rather simply structured individual intentions and beliefs. The analytic philosophy of social facts is to be found in the two circles in-between.

In the circle closest to the center we find Searle, and in the next we find Gilbert and Tuomela. Searle claims that there are irreducible we-intentions and we-beliefs. Gilbert and Tuomela claim that such intentions and beliefs can be reduced to what they call ‘mutual intentions’ and ‘mutual beliefs’ (including beliefs about norms), but that these cannot be further reduced to non-mutual I-intentions and I-beliefs. What, then, is a mutual belief between me and another person (you) to the effect that p? In my head (and correspondingly in yours), it consists in the following infinite progression:

(i) I believe that p,
(ii) I believe that you believe that p,
(iii) I believe that you believe that I believe that p,
(iv) I believe that you believe that I believe that you believe that p,
(v) I believe that you believe that I believe that you believe that I believe that you believe that p,

and so on, ad infinitum.

Searle’s analysis is much simpler. It consists in the view that it is possible that my head (and correspondingly yours) contains only the not further reducible belief: “We believe that p.”

In the nice paper “Social Ontology, Collective Intentionality, and Ockhamian Skepticism,” Frank Hindriks surveys the arguments that have been used against classical individualism and mentions some that have been marshaled against old-fashioned social holism. He finds that there are four main arguments in favor of modern analyses of collective intentionality: the argument from cooperation, the argument concerning divergence of content, the argument pertaining to social institutions, and the argument from everyday life

2. The We-As-Irreducible-We Approach

The paper that focuses most on Searle is Kay Mathiesen’s “Searle, Collective Intentions, and Individualism.” Mathiesen uses the important distinction between “intentional subject” and “subject of intention.” To be an intentional subject is to be a bearer of an intentional state such as an intention. Like the whole of analytic philosophy of social facts, she subscribes to ontological individualism, i.e., the view that only individuals can be intentional subjects. The subject of intention, on the other hand, is a part of an intentional state. An intention can, she claims, rightly in my opinion, either (i) completely lack a subject of intention, (ii) as a subject of intention have an I-intention, or (iii) as a subject of intention have a We-intention. Like Searle – and again I agree – she thinks there are irreducible We-intentions as subjects of intention; she calls this position phenomenological collectivism. So far, so good. But then she is not reading Searle with a principle of charity as her interpretative guide. Some words about that.

There is an ambiguity in Searle’s writings on collective intentions. Sometimes it is quite clear that he is only talking about what goes on in one head; but sometimes he writes as if he is talking about all the heads that, so to speak, belong to a real group intention. This ambiguity can easily be removed. One needs only to read Searle as if he is merely analyzing what might be called “veridical collective intentions.” Mathiesen, however, reads him as putting forward the astonishing view that one single individual intending “We intend to do A” can be a sufficient condition for a real group intention. No one should take seriously her accusation that Searle is a subjectivist. Nor her claim, which I have not discussed, that Searle does not manage to keep ontological and phenomenological collectivism distinct.

3. The We-As-Mutual-I-Beliefs Approach

Gilbert and Tuomela seem nowadays to have more or less the same position. In retrospect, they seem merely to have been interested in exploring and stressing different aspects of this common position. Gilbert has primarily focused on the normative aspects of groups and other collectives; Tuomela has primarily been botanizing among all the different kinds of we-intentions and we-actions there are in the world. Even though all collectives may require the same overarching general we-as-mutual-I-beliefs structure, they can of course differ greatly in detail and be arrived at by different routes.

In one of her two papers, Gilbert gives a good summary of her present position; and in the other she convincingly defends herself against the criticisms of her work that are put forward elsewhere in the book. In order to understand her position properly, one has to be aware of the way she looks upon the rights and obligations involved in ordinary acting together. “It may,” she says, “be misleading to describe them as moral obligations insofar as they need only the will of the parties to bring them into being.”

Tuomela tries in one of his papers to develop his view about how conditional mutual intentions of the form “I will do X if you will do X, but you will do X if I will do X …” can progress (be “deconditionalized”) into a real joint intention. In his paper “Responses to Critics,” he successfully defends his views against the criticisms put forward in this anthology. Much of it, he claims rightly, seems to depend on misunderstandings. It is deplorable that a lot of philosophers are so keen on criticism that they do not take care to understand the views they are commenting on.

4. Searle Vs. Gilbert and Tuomela

I have claimed that there is a gap between Searle on the one hand and Gilbert and Tuomela on the other. But, perhaps, I am wrong. Is this gap an illusion? The claim to the effect that there is such a gap is explicitly questioned in two papers (see pp 193 and 462), and explicitly endorsed in one (p 145). Tuomela himself says somewhat ambiguously that Searle “probably would object to the use of we-beliefs in my sense for the analysis of institutions” (p 420). However, I find this issue very clear-cut. Even though Tuomela has said that “we need a concept of we-intention which is irreducible to I-intentions” (quoted from p 193, note 11), what counts are his definitions. And in the definiens of these, one finds I-intentions only.

Here, I would like to take the opportunity to venture my own conjecture why the protagonists of the We-as-irreducible-We approach and the We-as-mutual-I-beliefs approach very seldom are able to enter into a real dialogue. My explanation has two components: (1) Most critics of Searle have not understood his concept of intentional state (as expounded in Intentionality), and Searle has not understood that the others have not understood this; (2) most writers in the Gilbert-Tuomela tradition take it so much for granted that one should look for necessary and/or sufficient conditions for “veridical” we-intentions and we-beliefs, that they can’t imagine that Searle is not trying do this too; Searle, though, is himself somewhat responsible for this misinterpretation.

5. Expanding the Territory

A natural question in view of the discussions described is whether this modern philosophy of social facts has repercussions on traditional philosophical disciplines such as logic, philosophy of language, epistemology, and ethics.

Georg Meggle regards social facts as a new area where doxastic and epistemic logic can profitably be applied. In his paper (“Mutual Knowledge and Belief”), he explores from such a logical point of view the distinction between groups where all the members believe/know that everybody in the group believes/knows that A, and groups where all the members believe/know that everybody else in the group believes/knows that A. This application does not imply any re-thinking of logic itself. However, with respect to the philosophy of language, Anthonie Meijers (“Dialogue, Understanding and Collective Intentionality”) forcefully argues that such a re-thinking is necessary. In both Grice’s theory of meaning and in his theory of conversation, Meijers find an unexplicated but irreducible collective dimension. Somewhat similarly, he finds such a dimension explicitly mentioned but nonetheless not worked out in speech-act theory. He is thinking of the concept of necessary “uptake.” According to both Austin and Searle, there is no promise if the corresponding speech act is not understood (“taken up”) by the promisee. In spite of this, they have never really tried to analyze this dependence between speaker and hearer. Meijers concludes: “Speech acts thus turn out to be social acts in a stronger sense than has traditionally been thought.”

With respect to epistemology, it is argued by Peter Baumann (“Epistemic Contracts”) “it is not individuals as such who know this or that but only individuals as members of epistemic communities or networks.” For Andrej Ule (“Common Knowledge in Science”), Baumann’s view is merely a truism and a point of departure for an investigation of the interplay between two kinds of “collective knowledge,” namely “distributed knowledge” and “common knowledge.”

Compared with the papers just mentioned, the papers that relate to utilitarianism, philosophy of law, evidential value, and simulation models have a somewhat unclear relation to the philosophy of social facts

6. Conclusion

To give an overall evaluation of this mosaic of an anthology would be like trying to add colors, shapes, and electrical charges together and then try to find a mean. An attempted evaluation of the book along these lines would also obscure the fact that some of the papers are quite good, while others fall short. Is such a variation in philosophical quality a necessary feature of an anthology? If ‘yes’, then this fact is surely a social fact.