Social Injustice: Essays in Political Philosophy

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Vittorio Bufacchi, Social Injustice: Essays in Political Philosophy, Palgrave Macmillan, 2012, 202pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780230251601.

Reviewed by Cillian McBride, Queen's University Belfast


As its subtitle suggests, this book is a collection of essays. Most of them were published between 2000 and 2008, although two chapters were written specially for this volume -- the title essay on social injustice and the concluding chapter reflecting on the future of socialist political theory, which has, for reasons more to do with the world's trajectory since the demise of Marxism, an oddly dated air to it. One of the pieces -- an illuminating discussion of the shortcomings of torture as a policy -- is co-authored with Jean Maria Arrigo, and others include a review essay on Brian Barry's Why Social Justice Matters, as well as a response to critics of one of the essays, a defence of 'sceptical' democracy. Perhaps this last might have been incorporated into a single version of the argument as it is a little difficult to reconstruct the positions of the respondents referred to in this piece.

Several essays touch on practical reason and moral psychology, but there is an account of grass-roots deliberative democracy amongst indigenous Mayans in Guatamala, and a discussion of responses to Downs' 'paradox of voting', i.e., the problem of understanding why apparently rational actors take the time to vote when the limited impact of their actions suggests it is not really worth their effort to do so. Nonetheless, despite their disparate subject matter, it is possible to discern some broad thematic concerns underlying these pieces. That said, anyone expecting an extended exploration of the nature of social injustice may be a little disappointed to find that the link between the project outlined in the opening chapter and the material collected in the body of the book is a little more tenuous than one might expect.

The underlying concern of the book is summed up in the claim that 'The point of political philosophy is not merely to create an arena where professional academics and students can play an increasingly sophisticated intellectual game, which is as highly stimulating as it is insignificant.' (p. 27) Bufacchi worries that the technical sophistication of much normative political philosophy has come at a price, namely, that it is has become detached from the real world moral and political problems that gave rise to the enterprise in the first place. The result is that much of this work threatens to become 'irrelevant outside university lecture theatres' (p. 29). The figure of Brian Barry, Bufacchi's former supervisor, looms large over this book and Bufacchi is clearly inspired not only by some of Barry's specific positions -- contractualism, impartiality, and ideas about the political role of scepticism about conceptions of the good -- but also by the spirit of Barry's work: the concern that theorising should never lose sight of the goal of addressing the problem of social injustice, and that in order to do so, it must engage with the social sciences. The point of political philosophy, Bufacchi insists, in his second chapter, is to 'expose and rectify social injustice' (p. 17).

Elsewhere, as in 'Sceptical Democracy', he defends particular positions adopted by Barry, in particular, the claim that political impartiality with respect to claims concerning the nature of the good life requires citizens to adopt a measure of scepticism towards their own ethical beliefs. Bufacchi claims that in a world characterized by ethical pluralism 'it is imperative for political democracy to embrace a political definition of scepticism' (p. 123) This view runs counter to the version of political liberalism formulated by Rawls and Nagel, for example, which seeks to ground political liberalism instead on overriding procedural reasons for exercising self-restraint in the public sphere. On this alternative view, which is not directly addressed in the discussion, we are not required to be sceptical about our deeply held ethical beliefs, but rather only to accept that the appropriate procedures provide overriding reasons not to act, in political matters, on these ethical commitments alone. One concern that the reader might have with the requirement of ethical scepticism as a ground for liberal politics may be that it appears to rely on a somewhat outdated set of empirical assumptions about secularisation. If there is no reason to suppose that modernity is leading towards an increasingly secular ethical consensus, then the appeal of Rawls' and Nagel's political liberalism may seem stronger than that of scepticism. In any event, it is not clear precisely how much work is really being done, in Bufacchi's account, by the idea of a fair procedure rather than by that of an epistemically oriented scepticism (see, for example, p. 133).

Questions of moral psychology are touched on in a number of the essays -- in 'The Injustice of Exploitation', 'Motivating Justice', 'The Enlightenment, Contractualism, and the Moral Polity', and 'Voting, Rationality, and Reputation'. In the first, Bufacchi takes issue with Marxist accounts of motivation as limited to attempts to secure economic advantage, and seeks to expand this to include the motive to morally degrade the exploited. This echoes the work, for example, of Axel Honneth who has sought to supplement standard accounts of social conflict in terms of the clash of economic interests with the idea of struggles for recognition -- in which our senses of self-respect and self-esteem are centrally implicated. Injustice on this view inevitably involves a failure to recognise victims as moral equals. While Bufacchi is right to point to the limitations of the old Marxist account, one might wonder if it plausible to suggest that misrecognition is necessarily driven by a motive to humiliate and degrade (p. 53), or whether social institutions can have this effect even if those who benefit from them are oblivious to their impact on others. Viewed in terms of recognition, the victims of injustice often become simply invisible. Rather than becoming the focus of deliberate cruelty the invisibility of the victims of injustice means that they just don't count in the eyes of the powerful.

What is refreshing, however, is the way that Bufacchi does not seek to throw the broadly Kantian project of impartial justification overboard in the name of a more 'empirical', problem-oriented political philosophy. Often it is precisely this Kantian current in contemporary political philosophy which provokes complaints about 'idealism' and 'abstraction' from those of a more hermeneutic or empirical bent. Bufacchi, however, seeks to combine the moral rigor of Kantian egalitarianism with attention to the complexity of concrete moral and political problems. While he adheres to a contractualist model of justification, he seeks to assimilate Humean insights into the 'mixed' nature of our moral psychology into his account of institutional design (p. 109). He is no doubt right in his claim that 'Finding ways to motivate people to act justly is arguably the most pressing challenge facing egalitarians in their fight against social injustice.' (p. 110)

The idea of adopting a more 'empirical' or 'bottom-up' approach to political philosophy drives the key claim of the book's opening essay: 'Making Sense of Social Injustice'. Bufacchi points out that while the literature on social justice is extensive, there is surprisingly little reference to the phenomenon of injustice. This is problematic, he argues, because 'Justice is derivative upon injustice in the same way that medicine is derivative upon illness . . . Injustice is the fundamental problem towards which a theory of justice is the solution.' (p. ix.) Bufacchi reviews attempts by Amartya Sen and Alan Dershowitz to list concrete injustices by way of a preliminary to developing a theory of justice, but finds them wanting because they fail to explain what these various injustices have in common -- our intuitions here require a theoretical explanation. Thomas Pogge's account of social justice is promising, but too focused, he claims, on institutions, and not enough on individual motivations. Iris Young's sceptical response to what she takes to be the exclusive concern of distributive justice with the distribution of economic resources is praised, however, for its sensitivity to issues of 'exclusion'. Ultimately, Bufacchi claims, we need an account of injustice that encompasses three sets of questions: about 'maldistribution', 'exclusion', and 'disempowerment' (pp. 9-10).

There is something attractively pragmatist about the presentation of theories of justice as responses to concrete moral and social problems. They are not to be viewed as Platonic constructions reflecting some more basic ideal order in the universe, but as tools for solving practical problems. In political philosophy, it is the politics that comes first. However, on reflection, it is less clear that the situation is quite as simple as this: are we really putting the cart before the horse when we set out to organise our inchoate ideas about justice into a defensible theory? While we certainly want the resulting theories to act as practical guides to action, their role cannot be limited to that of responding to the independently identified problems of injustice. How would we recognise injustice in the world if we did not already hold some beliefs about what constituted just arrangements?

In the absence of these essentially normative expectations of the world, we could not, as Strawson suggests in his famous discussion of reactive attitudes, make sense of emotional reactions such as resentment. There is no strictly 'empirical' account of injustice then, and the social scientific investigation of the mechanisms of disadvantage needs to be directed, in the first instance, by theories of justice to identify certain situations and interactions as unjust, and therefore morally problematic. Arguably the primary role of a normative theory of justice is to reveal injustice in social life rather than to work out political responses to it -- a task for which the disciplines of economics and social policy may be better suited. The great contribution, then, of egalitarian theories of justice is precisely that they reveal moral problems with many aspects of the market that are invisible to libertarians etc. To this extent, it is not clear that 'reversing the relationship between social justice and social injustice has major implications for the way we approach some of the key issues in moral and political philosophy' (p. 3). Theories of social justice are, necessarily, theories of social injustice.

Indeed, when we look at Bufacchi's three dimensions of injustice, it is not clear that these really require a significant rethinking of existing theories of justice: questions about the justice of a particular distribution can easily encompass concerns about exclusion and disempowerment, once we remember that distributive questions are not in fact limited to questions about the distribution of economic resources, but cover questions about the distribution of, to take Rawls' account of the primary goods, rights, liberties, opportunities, wealth, income, and 'the social bases of self-respect.' Questions of social and political exclusion, then, can be seen precisely as problems of distribution, as can questions of disempowerment, to the extent that these pose questions about the distribution of power, formal and informal. Only on the false assumption that distributive justice is exclusively concerned with the distribution of economic resources does it seem necessary to handle 'exclusion' and 'disempowerment' as distinct problems. Following from this, we might also wonder whether these three spheres are governed by the same principle of justice, or whether we are to understand them in a pluralist, Walzerian sense as each governed by their own distinct principles? We might suspect that the wrongness of 'maldistribution', 'exclusion' and 'disempowerment' is explained by their respective departures from equality, but it may be that Bufacchi prefers some alternative principle or set of principles.

If there is to be a role for a distinct theory of social injustice, i.e., a theory that does different work to that of a normative theory of justice, it may be that we should look for a different sort of theory altogether. This may, for example, take the form of a more sociological account of the interconnections between experiences of injustice, one which seeks to explain the complexity of our responses to unjust circumstances, including adaptive preference formation. As indicated above, the provocative, and interesting, claims made in this opening chapter are not really followed up in the subsequent essays -- and to this extent it reads rather like the introduction to a book not yet written. Bufacchi succeeds, however, in making the elaboration of such a theory, whatever form it may ultimately take, sound like an intriguing and worthwhile project.