Social Inquiry after Wittgenstein and Kuhn: Leaving Everything as It Is

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John G. Gunnell, Social Inquiry after Wittgenstein and KuhnLeaving Everything as It Is, Columbia University Press, 2014, 256pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780231169400.

Reviewed by Vasso Kindi, University of Athens


As the title suggests, the book aims to show that Wittgenstein's philosophy and Kuhn's work are significant for social inquiry. Even though the author is well aware of Wittgenstein's anti-theoretical stance and the non-empirical character of his philosophy, he maintains, on the one hand, that both Kuhn's and Wittgenstein's works are themselves exercises in social inquiry (they are on the same side with the social sciences in contrast to the side of the natural sciences), bringing about important innovations, and, on the other, that they provide theoretical accounts of social practices such as linguistic and scientific practices, enriching our understanding of the conventional phenomena that constitute them.

One key concern that runs through the book and is again reflected in the title is Wittgenstein's remark in the Philosophical Investigations that philosophy "leaves everything as it is" (PI §124). How can Wittgenstein's philosophy be therapeutic and, in general, efficacious and yet leave everything as it is? John Gunnell does not think that this remark implies a conservative or complacent attitude towards the way things are -- an interpretation often given of this particular statement -- nor does he think that the remark reflects the fact that Wittgenstein's philosophy does not have cognitive aspirations, another commonplace in Wittgensteinian literature. Gunnell's view turns on the distinction he draws between presentation and representation. Representation, as Gunnell understands it, requires that the object represented can be accessed independently of the representation whereas presentation constitutes its object through conceptualization. According to him, social inquiry is engaged in representing already given meaningful social facts and, therefore, can only leave them alone in the effort to understand and interpret them. If it affects them, it may end up distorting them.

This is an interesting reversal of the standard understanding of the relation between social and natural sciences and their respective subject matters. The most common idea is that the natural sciences confront an independently existing subject matter (e.g., the physical world) whereas the social sciences cannot but interfere, to some extent at least, with what they study. For instance, an anthropological investigation may affect the culture it takes as its object of study. Gunnell thinks things are the other way around. Natural science makes presentational claims through conceptualization constituting its subject matter -- "there is no gap, we might say, between theory and fact" (59) -- whereas social science and philosophy, as practiced by Wittgenstein, confront already meaningful practices, which they leave alone if they are to be understood properly as what they are.

That is how Gunnell makes sense of Wittgenstein's idea that philosophy leaves everything as it is. He does not want to deny, however, that Wittgenstein's and Kuhn's philosophy can transform their respective disciplines, philosophy and philosophy of science. Given that, according to Gunnell, social inquiry (including philosophy as practiced by Wittgenstein and philosophy of science as practiced by Kuhn) is a second-order practice that studies other practices, Gunnell thinks that it is bound to reflect upon itself and its relation to its subject matter so that it represents it properly, thereby reforming or revolutionizing itself.

The above claims are central to the book. Gunnell sees Kuhn's work in the philosophy and history of science as an exemplification of the Wittgensteinian approach to philosophy, and views both as forms of social inquiry that can revolutionize the field without betraying the Wittgensteinian dictum of leaving everything as it is. Their contribution consists in rejecting metaphysical projects and typical philosophical aspirations (e.g., adjudicating authoritatively over theoretical conflicts) while endorsing as appropriate for philosophy an investigation into the nature of conventions that shape human practices.

The book has seven chapters, a Preface and an Introduction. Two chapters (1 and 6) focus mostly on Kuhn, the others mostly on Wittgenstein. I say 'mostly' because Gunnell features a significant number of other philosophical positions from general philosophy of science and from contemporary philosophy in the course of presenting Kuhn's and Wittgenstein's work.

In Chapter 1 Gunnell's aim is to reject the charge of relativism leveled against Kuhn. Gunnell  presents this challenge by concentrating on what filmmaker Errol Morris, a former student of Kuhn's at Princeton, had to say on his blog in 2011 about an incident between them which, reminiscent of the notorious poker incident between Popper and Wittgenstein, purportedly involved Kuhn throwing an ashtray at Morris over philosophical differences. Morris, who thought that Kuhn "had Wittgenstein and Hitler on his mind" when writing Structure, accused Kuhn of relativism, postmodernism and of denigrating truth. Gunnell's response is that these charges are motivated by the kind of philosophy that makes trans- or supra-scientific judgments about the criteria of truth. Kuhn, however, in Gunnell's view, influenced by Wittgenstein through Cavell, relays truth to "its rightful owners", the scientists, who have the theoretical criteria to judge rival claims. Gunnell also dismisses charges that Kuhn advocated a conservative agenda of political complacency, arguing that philosophy is not a normative enterprise to be used for social reform. It should "leave everything as it is", which for Gunnell means that it should problematize the relationship between philosophy and its subject matter.

In Chapter 2 Gunnell foregrounds Wittgenstein's use of examples from anthropology and attributes to him the claim that "it is essential to 'look at things form an ethnological point of view, in order to see things more objectively", although he acknowledges that Wittgenstein did not think that philosophy is ethnology. The actual Wittgensteinian remark from Culture and Value (1998, 45), however, is that "If we use the ethnological approach . . . it only means we are taking up our position far outside, in order to see the things more objectively". Gunnell asserts what Wittgenstein hypothesizes in order to buttress the claim that Wittgenstein's philosophy is a form of social inquiry. He finds support for the same claim in Peter Winch's Idea of a Social Science and Its Relation to Philosophy, where a central part of sociology is taken to belong to philosophy as long as the former deals with the nature of social phenomena. Gunnell maintains that Wittgenstein advances "a theory of language and conventions" (54) in the Philosophical Investigations despite the fact that Wittgenstein rejected theory construction, as Gunnell acknowledges. In the same chapter the author presents his distinction between presenting and representing, arguing that the practice of social science and philosophy is representational, i.e., a form of interpretation of discursive objects.

Chapters 3, 4, 5 and 7 give an overview of Wittgenstein's philosophy starting from Philosophical Grammar and the Blue and Brown Books, continuing with the Philosophical Investigations, Zettel and the Remarks on the Philosophy of Psychology, and ending with On Certainty, the Tractatus and the "Lecture on Ethics". The aim is to show that philosophy according to Wittgenstein, much like the social sciences, does not deal directly with the world but with meaningful social phenomena developing a theory of conventions. This approach Gunnell calls "conventional realism" (149).

In the course of this presentation, the author gives (Ch. 3) a quick overview of mentalism -- the assumption that meaning resides in the mind -- and interpretism -- the view that meaning is constructed all the way down by the interpeter -- offering snippets of Locke's, Grice's, Fodor's, Pinker's, and Searle's work as well as references to Foucault, Gadamer and Derrida. He then presents challenges to both mentalism and intrepretism, covering material from Rorty, Sellars, Davidson and, of course, Wittgenstein, who is taken to challenge representational philosophy (i.e., philosophy as the mirror of nature) and to defend instead philosophy as social inquiry engaged in representing discursive objects. Wittgenstein, however, is also engaged, according to Gunnell, in presenting (and not representing) the nature of language even though his work is distinct from that of natural science, which is committed to presenting the world.

In Chapters 4 and 5 the author finds similarities between Max Weber's ideal types and Wittgenstein's language games, since they are both objects of comparison that, as such, can aid understanding but not depict reality. The comparison seems problematic since Weberian ideal types, although not hypotheses, are supposed to guide the formulation of hypotheses in order to check how distant individual cases are from the ideal. In that respect Weber's ideal types differ from Wittgenstein's language games. The comparison extends in Ch. 6 to Kuhn whose concepts, Gunnell claims, have been wrongly reified rather than seen as ideal types and perspicuous representations. But, first, perspicuous representations -- a Wittgensteinian concept -- at least as used by Wittgenstein, are certainly not ideal models, and secondly, Kuhn's concepts such as "paradigm" are notoriously ambiguous and, as the author acknowledges, elastic with blurred edges. How can they be similar to ideal types, which, according to Weber, are supposed to be strictly and unambiguously defined?

Chapter 6, apart from presenting Kuhn's work as not pontificating over what scientists do but rather as a type of social inquiry trying to understand scientific practice and change, also offers discussions of Feyerabend's and Lakatos's contributions to philosophy of science as well as references to Hempel's and Popper's work.

Overall the book succeeds in bringing out the affinities between a number of thinkers, especially between Wittgenstein and Kuhn, and in highlighting the particular character of their contribution, which is neither empirical in the sense of that of the natural sciences nor armchair a priori. Still, the claim that Wittgenstein's philosophy, but also Kuhn's, are types of social inquiry runs contrary to expressed statements made by both and to the overall orientation of their work. The status of Kuhn's work is at least controversial. Kuhn has said that his model can be derived from first principles and insisted on separating the work of the historian from that of the philosopher. His work has been read as historical but also as philosophical in a deflationary Wittgensteinian way.

The case with Wittgenstein is much more pronounced. Wittgenstein explicitly denies that philosophy is ethnology (Culture and Value 1998, p. 45), and he repeatedly stressed that philosophy is not one of the sciences (Tractatus 4.111). He actually wrote "Philosophy is not one of the natural sciences (The word 'philosophy' must mean something whose place is above or below the natural sciences, not beside them)", but I doubt that he meant to exclude the social sciences from that category. The reason is that he identifies the whole of natural science with the totality of true propositions (4.11). The same claim is made in the Philosophical Investigations (§109), where he says that "our considerations must not be scientific ones". Philosophy, according to Wittgenstein, is not a body of doctrine (4.112), it is not a cognitive discipline, it does not give us truths and it is controversial whether we can even ascribe to it a subject matter, as Gunnell insists. "The philosopher is not a citizen of any community of ideas" (Zettel §455). Wittgenstein is also explicitly opposed to theories. A theory has no value for him and claims that "we may not advance any kind of theory" (PI §109).

Gunnell is aware of these claims in relation to both Wittgenstein and Kuhn. But he does not really address and concretely discuss them vis-a-vis his contention that philosophy for Wittgenstein and Kuhn is on a par with social science. In his Introduction, in relation to the controversy in the literature about how to interpret the Tractatus, Gunnell says that his response is "to acknowledge it but sidestep it". I think he follows the same line in relation to tensions that emerge in the course of presenting the various philosophical positions. He acknowledges the tensions but sidesteps them and moves on.

This is vividly alluded to by a simile found in the Introduction: that the author will avoid getting engaged with every nuance of the secondary literature and instead will "follow how the remarks flow, maybe like a river" (9). Indeed, the reader is faced with an extensive collection of quotes -- Gunnell says that some readers may think that he quotes excessively (xii) -- from the original sources, which flow incessantly, are liberally treated and cited en masse. The passages to be cited are so many that all the references are often given at the end of a paragraph, making it very difficult at times to identify which passage is found where. Determined "not to stop at each bend" (9) and having to cover a vast area, Gunnell does not pause to discuss certain issues and their implications for the book's argument. For instance, in relation to the pivotal distinction between the presentational character of the natural sciences and the representational character of philosophy and the social sciences, he does not discuss the possibility, and the implications, of social sciences making presentational claims. When historians, for example, choose to identify particular events as revolutions rather than as evolutionary developments, or when they speak of massacres instead of genocides, we might say that they are making presentational claims. Also, he does not consider how Kuhn's internalist historical method affects the book's claim that Kuhn's work belongs to social inquiry. The two may not be in tension, but the author does not pause to consider it. The same can be said about the claim that Kuhn returns the concept of truth to the scientists who, unlike philosophers of the old fashioned representationalist type, are not supposed to face problems of relativism. But what happens, then, to the concept of incommensurability, which is supposed to apply to the level of practice where scientists make their comparative judgments? Similarly, Gunnell doesn't explain how Kuhn could have acknowledged his debt to Norwood Russell Hanson and yet "never accepted Hanson's image of observations as 'theory-laden'" (182). Saying that Kuhn's conception is closer to the Kantian 'synthetic a priori' and Wittgenstein's grammatical propositions does not help much to illuminate the issue. This is especially so given the fact that Hanson's "theory-ladenness of observation" was influenced by Wittgenstein's work and that it is widely believed that Kuhn had indeed accepted Hanson's image of observations as "theory-laden".

The book offers a fresh reading of Kuhn's and Wittgenstein's work by making new connections and highlighting aspects that are often neglected in the literature. It also defends an understanding of their work that does not lapse into the more or less standard topoi of criticism, i.e., relativism and irrationalism. But I think key contentions of the book need to be more extensively argued.