Social Ontology: Collective Intentionality and Group Agents

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Raimo Tuomela, Social Ontology: Collective Intentionality and Group Agents, Oxford University Press, 2013, 310pp. $74.00 (hbk) ISBN 9780199978267.

Reviewed by Seumas Miller, Charles Sturt University/Delft University of Technology


In his latest book on collective intentionality and group agents Raimo Tuomela builds on, but also to a considerable extent duplicates, the theoretical work published in a number of his previous books and articles as well as on the work of others in the field, notably (in the case of social institutions) John Searle, but also (in the case of joint action/joint intentions) Michael Bratman, Margaret Gilbert, myself and others.

The book has nine chapters, and they deal with the following topics (respectively): groups and group thinking; collective intentions; acting for social reasons; collective acceptance and the formation of group attitudes; cooperation and authority; we-reasoning in game theoretic contexts; institutional facts and institutions; group solidarity. Tuomela offers sophisticated analyses of most of the above-mentioned concepts. Moreover, he extends the set of analyses put forward in earlier works, in particular in relation to hierarchically structured "non-democratic" groups or organisations, social reasoning and group solidarity. Accordingly, this book will be of great interest to theorists working on collective intentionality and social ontology. For reasons of space, I will focus on two central issues and associated analyses in the book, namely: (1) collective intentions and (2) social reasons.

Collective Intentions

The salient collective attitudes in question in the book are collective intentions, such as we-intentions (e.g. some group we-intends to paint a house). The contrast here is with individual attitudes, such as individual intentions said by Tuomela to be in the I-mode (e.g. Jones I-intends to paint his wall).

In relation to the key theoretical notion of collective intentions, specifically we-mode intentions (Chapters 1, 2 and 3), Tuomela positions himself as a non-reductionist collectivist. In this regard he sides with collectivists such as Gilbert and Searle and against individualists such as myself . On the other hand, Tuomela has a bet both ways by claiming that whereas such collective intentions are conceptually irreducible, nevertheless they are not ontologically-existing, causally operative attitudes. Paradoxically, the upshot of this two-way bet is that Tuomela is apparently some kind of reductionist in respect of we-intentions, qua mental phenomena, while being an non-reductionist in respect of these intentional states qua collective phenomena. How so?

In relation to his claimed ontologically non-existent and causally inoperative collective attitudes he invokes heuristic notions such as the 'as if' intentional stance. More specifically, he argues that collective attitudes are based on group members' "collective attribution of attitudes to the group" (p. 23). This is an inherently unstable position in so far as one holds the entirely plausible common sense view -- as evidently Tuomela does (p. 23) -- that individual human mental states, notably I-intentions, are in some sense real existents necessarily possessed of "intrinsic intentionality" (p. 23) and, at least potentially, phenomenal properties, and are not merely 'as if' constructions or reducible to, for example, functional roles. For if individual human intentions and beliefs are not merely 'constructions' consequent upon an 'as if' intentional stance, or otherwise reducible to functional roles or some such, and yet (we-mode) collective intentions and beliefs are, then arguably such collective beliefs and intentions are not really beliefs and intentions at all.

Tuomela tends to equate individualism with methodological individualism, which he identifies in practice with rational choice theory. This is misleading in relation to contemporary individualist theorising on collective intentionality and sociality. Moreover, it has the consequence that in his dismissal of individualism Tuomela has made things too easy for himself. The contemporary individualist theorists who have contributed to notions of joint action/joint intention, social institutions and the like are not necessarily methodological individualists; they are not what Charles Taylor refers to as 'atomists'[1]. An individualist can be, and in my view ought to be, a relational individualist. Relational individualism emphasises -- in addition to individual actions and ends -- interdependent cooperative action in the service of shared interdependent individual ends (collective ends in my parlance[2]) on the part of socially and organisationally situated individual human beings. Accordingly, there is no barrier to relational individualists’ positing irreducibly collective interests and goods as fundamental 'rock-bottom' explanations for the behaviour of individuals. Consider, for example, fraternity; surely it is valued for its own sake by individuals and motivates their cooperative action accordingly.

Moreover, methodological individualism has typically been committed to the reduction of collective entities to their constitutive human members and their relations, but this is not true of relational individualism; rather relational individualism is committed only to avoiding the ascription of mental states to collective entities per se. Again, relational individualism (but not methodological individualism) is not averse to social norms, roles, etc. being in part constitutive (in some sense) of individual actors or of individual actors reasoning from collective interests/goods to individual action (see below).

Further, rational choice theory is held by some to be consistent with certain forms of non-reductionist collectivism. Such theorists can utilise the self-interested, rational actor model to analyse, for instance, market interactions between corporations, while simultaneously holding such organisations to be agents in their own right possessed of intentional states not necessarily possessed by their members. Peter French is a case in point[3].

Tuomela introduces what he regards as an individualist intentional notion and uses it as a foil against individualism throughout the book; this is what he calls a pro-group I-mode attitude. Supposedly the possessor of such an attitude is "functioning as a 'private' person but still at least in part for the group when in a group context" (p. 5). This notion of a "private" attitude of a "private" person (or, relatedly, a "personal" attitude), which is used throughout the book, is somewhat opaque and, to the extent that it is not opaque, question-begging.

Thus Tuomela says: "I use the word 'private' basically to mean (purely) personal. . . . (i.e., not intrinsically based on a social group's properties)" (p. 266n13). But the only relevant non-controversial attitudes (and persons) in play, whether one is an individualist or a collectivist, are attitudes such as 'My intention that we dance' or 'My intention that I do my part of painting the house' (and persons possessed of such attitudes).

Such attitudes are in part constitutive of some joint or otherwise group activity, are interdependent with the like attitudes of the other members of the group in question, and are a matter of common knowledge among the members of that group. These joint actions and their constitutive pro-group I-mode attitudes consist both of purely individual actions and attitudes (e.g., one single human agent's contributory individual action and individual intention to perform that action) as well as social actions and attitudes (e.g., the joint action itself and the shared interdependent end constitutive of that joint action -- a pro-group I-mode attitude). That is, these joint actions and, in particular, their constitutive pro-group I-mode attitudes are social in some sense.

Certainly these pro-group I-mode attitudes are not 'private' or 'purely personal' in any ordinary sense of those terms. Indeed, evidently they are individual human intentions, beliefs, etc. which are interdependent, constitutive of human cooperative activity, the motivating reason for the contributory single actions of the human agents in question and publically known (in the sense of being objects of common knowledge among the members of the group in question). Nor is Tuomela's throwaway line that they are not intrinsically social helpful; it merely begs the question against individualists.

Tuomela claims (p. 67) that the I-mode/we-mode distinction is not based on the content of the attitudes in question nor on attitude type, e.g., that it is an intention or a belief. So what is this mysterious 'third dimension' of mode upon which the distinction rests? Perhaps it is simply that the subject of the attitude in question is not 'I' but 'we', as Tuomela suggests: "In the we-mode case the intending subject is 'we,' and in the I-mode case it is 'I'" (p. 67). Apparently, there is no third dimension; rather there is a new subject of we-mode attitudes: a collective agent. Naturally, this collective agent will need to be irreducibly collective, otherwise individualism reappears by way of intentions of the form 'I intend that we-x'. Moreover, the mystery of sui-generis we-attitudes has only been dispelled by supplanting it with the mystery of irreducibly collective agents.

At any rate, Tuomela ultimately cashes out we-mode attitudes in terms of familiar notions in the literature, crucially that of "qua member of [group] g" and "collective acceptance" (p. 68).[4] However, the question now arises as to the adequacy of the analysis in terms of these notions and, in particular, the acceptability of the we-mode/pro-group I-mode distinction. This is where the rubber hits the road.

Tuomela's attempt to make good this crucial (for him) distinction between we-mode and pro-group I-mode thinking runs as follows. He says:

collective intentionality (we-mode in my terms) requires that agents intend to act together as a group and thus, according to my approach, for the same authoritative group reason, and also satisfy the criteria or markers of collective commitment and the collectivity condition (a kind of "necessarily being in the same boat" condition). (p. 6)


Comparing pro-group I-mode thinking with we-mode thinking, the crucial differences are, respectively, the change of agency from individual to collective (or group agency) and the change of I-reasoning to we-reasoning. These differences also account for the claimed irreducibility of the we-mode to the I-mode. (p. 7)

Here there are two separable moves. The first consists of making the distinction between pro-group I-mode and we-mode simply one of degree -- notwithstanding that pro-group I-mode is cast as being in the individualist I-mode rather than in the we-mode. This move consists of explicitly adding additional non-normative conditions to bind the agents in question closer together; additional 'glue' is supposedly added to pro-group I-mode attitudes/actions. The crucial such condition is that of acting together as a group.

However, such 'additional' coating is not sufficient to ground a fundamental conceptual difference between pro-social I-mode and we-mode such that the latter is irreducibly and intrinsically social while the former is merely 'personal'. This is because the 'glue' in question may itself be reducible to individualist notions. Importantly, as I have argued in detail elsewhere[5], acting qua member of a group can be analysed as acting in according with an individual end that each agent has interdependently with the others (a shared interdependent end). Moreover, this condition is already implicitly met by many, if not all, pro-group I-mode attitudes. If one acts on the basis of a pro-group I-mode attitude constitutive of a joint action to which one is a contributor, then in doing so one is acting qua member of the group (the group whose members consist of those contributing to the joint action).

Tuomela's second move is to import into the definition of the we-mode normative notions that are self-evidently (or at least plausibly regarded as) intrinsically social; specifically, authoritative group reason and collective commitment. However, the question here is whether he is simply offering a stipulative definition of we-intentions as involving institutional and/or moral normative notions of authority and commitment (or some other non-controversially intrinsically social normative notions), or whether the normative notions in question are somehow derivable from that of a we-intention.

If the former, fair enough; but the individualist can also make this move by providing pro-group I-mode attitudes and associated joint actions with a normative moral or institutional loading, e.g., specifying that pro-social I mode attitudes have moral or institutional normative content or that there are normative constraints (e.g., laws) on certain joint actions or that their ends are normative in character (e.g., are moral goods)[6].

If the latter, then there is much work to be done in the provision of the derivations in question, and it is unclear whether this work has been successfully done. Specifically, it is very unclear that, as Tuomela claims following Gilbert[7], "joint intention entails collective commitment" (p. 83). Here there appears to be an equivocation between commitment in the sense of a moral or quasi-moral obligation and commitment in the sense of non-revisablility -- at some point immediately prior to performing an action the intention-in-action is non-revisable. The latter is derivable from a joint intention but the former is not; yet it is the former that Tuomela requires.

The other derivation that Tuomela requires pertains to collective acceptance. Once again there appears to be equivocation. Tuomela says, "participants collectively accept a content (proposition) as true or correct for the group just in case they come, in a way involving their explicit or implicit agreement, to share a we-mode joint attitude" (p. 126). So collective acceptance depends on explicit or implicit agreement. Clearly explicit agreements are a form of promise making and as such presuppose institutional and moral normativity. What of implicit agreements? Implicit agreements are agreements just as implicit promises are promises. Therefore, implicit agreements are a form of promise making and the problem remains. Tuomela invokes the notion of a convention (p. 146) to try to extricate himself from this problem. But this is unhelpful in so far as joint intentions do not entail conventions and question begging in so far as conventions are regarded as intrinsically social phenomena.

Social Reasons

Chapter 4 ('Acting for Social Reasons') consists of a discussion of group reasons, including the reasons for a group to act (as opposed to an individual) and the reasons for an individual to act qua member of a group. Group reasons are elaborated further in Chapter 7.

According to Tuomela,

a person acts for a we-mode reason if he takes as a central reason for that action what his salient group wants, intends, believes, etc. -- in general something that requires his participation as a group member. Here the reason is based on collective acceptance based rather than being simply intersubjective in an other-regarding I-mode sense. (p. 102)

 If I-mode is here stripped of notions of acting as a member of a social group, etc., then this distinction between we-mode and I-mode reasoning made here by Tuomela will hold up. But what if it is not? What if a relational individualist account is available to strengthen I-mode reasons, as in fact is the case (as I noted above).

Chapter 7 ('We-reasoning and game theory') builds on Chapter 4. I am sympathetic to Tuomela's view that rational choice theory is unable to provide solutions to prisoner-dilemmas and related collective action problems; the case for this has been made in the philosophical and other literature. Moreover, I am in agreement with the general move he makes in the direction of reasoning from common goals to individual actions (in his case common goals to which members of social groups and organisations are strongly committed).

Tuomela offers an account of collective reasoning in terms of what he calls "we-reasoning". Roughly speaking, he posits a group with an integrated membership such that the group members are committed to a common goal, say, the maximisation of group utility, and this allows him to infer on the part of each group-member-reasoner that s/he will do his part. The strong commitment to maximisation of group utility -- at the expense of individual self-interest or otherwise self-oriented goals -- enables Tuomela to avoid the problems that beset individual rational self-interested actor models.

Tuomela is surely correct in holding that individual human agents can, and often do, engage in action-determining reasoning from collective goals and interests to individual actions, including from (but not I think only from), collective goals and interests to which members of social groups and organisations are strongly morally and/or institutionally committed. However, Tuomela also holds that such acceptance implies an irreducibly collective agent (or reasoner). This I dispute.

Doubtless, individual reasoning from common goals and collective interests to their own individual action requires a conception of an individual human agent qua member of a social group or organisation. But as already mentioned the latter notion can be given an individualist analysis.

There are further points to be made in relation to collective goals and interests. Let us again take fraternity as our example. First, fraternity can enter into the content of an individual's intentional (I-mode) states, e.g., 'Jones believes in fraternity'. Second, the individual can internalise the collective good of fraternity as a good that is, and ought to be, pursued and enjoyed by the members of the social group to which he or she belongs. Third, the commitment to fraternity on the part of any individual member of the group in question can, and often does, rationally dominate the individual's individually rationally self-interested goals in play. Fourth, fraternity is embraced by the individuals in question in the knowledge that it is irreducibly collective in character in that it cannot be produced by any one agent acting alone or enjoyed by only one agent. Fifth, fraternity can provide a fundamental 'rock bottom' explanation for the cooperative behaviour of individuals.

This capacity of individuals to reason from, and act in accordance with, collective goals and interests is not without its problems. For example, the collective goals in question might be inherently morally problematic, and a commitment to them might come to dominate the exercise of individual autonomy, as in the case of totalitarian regimes such as the Third Reich. So contemporary collectivists and relational individualists alike do not necessarily escape the political and moral problems confronted by collectivists of days gone by.

On the other hand, contemporary collectivists have much more in common conceptually with the likes of Oswald Spengler than relational individualists. Here I stress that Tuomela himself is a liberal. More specifically, he seems to favour liberal communitarianism (p. 17), and thereby explicitly distances himself from authoritarian collectivism. Nevertheless, conceptually speaking, his collectivist notions do in fact echo some of those past collectivists whose moral and political views he abjures: "in a we-mode group the members are supposed to function as group members almost as if they were intentionally functioning as parts of an organism" (p. 34) and "An ideal we-moder can think and act only for group-centred motives, regardless of whether they conflict with individualistic motives" (p. 38).

Here I simply note that social contexts dominated by collectivist interests to the point where individual defection is not capable of even being rationally entertained, as opposed to being entertained, weighed and rationally overridden, constitute a potential threat to individual autonomy. Consider Tuomela's reframing of various rational choice games as only involving choices between coordination equilibria, the combinations of actions involving individual defections having been eliminated. He says: "In the pure (or ideal) we-mode case private desires are completely set aside -- because the group is the agent -- so that in principle there is no incentive for properly functioning group members to free-ride, in contrast to the (pro-group) I-mode case" (p. 16). This is inadequate qua representation of the actual states of affairs in question; inadequate because incomplete with respect to the option to defect (including to free-ride). Alternatively, they are representations of collective actions in which the individual actors are not possessed of genuine individual autonomy since defection is simply not an option (rational or otherwise) for them.

Here, as elsewhere, the capacity of individuals to engage in practical reasoning based on objective moral principles, as opposed to collectivist principles, values and interests is of fundamental importance. But what of so-called social reasoning from a relational individualist standpoint?

Practical reasoning from moral principles, such as impartiality, is evidently something individuals can unproblematically do; the principles in question are part of the content of the beliefs, ends or desires that they engage in their practical reasoning. Therefore, as mentioned above, the content of an individual's beliefs (or other attitudes) constitutive (in part) of his individual practical reasoning can also comprise collectivist principles, values and interests, in which case the individual in question can act for a social reason qua content of his/her relevant individual beliefs, ends and desires.

How would this work in practice? Let us take Tuomela's example of the Hi-Lo game (p. 187). In such an example individuals can have as part of the content of their I-mode beliefs and ends that HiHi is better than LoLo and that LoLo is better than HiLo or LoHi and that, therefore, the end of each ought to be HiHi. The important point to stress here is that by the lights of relational individualist theory, individual human agents in contexts of interdependent action are not necessarily restricted, as Tuomela assumes (p. 187), to having beliefs, ends, etc. with respect to their own actions conditionally on the actions of others. Specifically, and as I have argued in detail elsewhere[8], relational individualism can allow that such individuals can have beliefs and ends with respect to sets of actions constituted by their own actions as well as the actions of others, and also with respect to the outcomes of such sets of actions.

This being so, there is no impediment to relational individualists solving Hi-Lo games and the like in essentially the manner that Tuomela recommends -- and which I have also recommended elsewhere.[9] For it follows quite straightforwardly from each having the end that HiHi -- in a context of common knowledge that each can Hi, but no-one can bring about HiHi by acting alone -- that each ought to form the intention to Hi (and thus individually choose Hi). This is practical reasoning from individual (I-mode) beliefs and ends with collective content to individual action, but the reasoning in question is, notwithstanding the collective content of the I-mode attitudes, a process of individual reasoning.

A final point. On the individualist relational model the single mind (so to speak) of each individual reasoner weighs his or her individually self-interested considerations against (possibly irreducibly collectivist) collective interests, moral considerations and so on. That is, on the individualist model any given process of reasoning takes place seamlessly and unproblematically in a single unitary (individual) mind. By contrast, on Tuomela's model, a problem arises with respect to the connection between the reasoning of the collective agent-reasoner ("group agent's reasons" (p. 39)) and the reasoning ("group reasons simpliciter" (p. 39)) of any given individual participating agent-reasoner; how is the process of reasoning at the collective level supposed to engage with the process of reasoning at the level of individual members? Specifically, how can there be a single seamless, or at least somehow integrated, process of reasoning between the collective and the individual levels?

Tuomela is evidently aware of the problem and invokes "we-mode we-reasoning that the members engage in" (p. 39) to provide the needed connection. But rather than solve the problem this simply moves it to a different location. The we-mode we-reasoning of the individual members can appropriately engage with the group reasoning simpliciter of these individual members; these processes of reasoning all take place at the level of the individual members. But the collective level (collective) agent/reasoner/reasoning to individual level (individual) agent/reasoner/reasoning 'connection problem' reappears elsewhere, namely, between the reasoning of the collective agent-reasoner ("group agent's reasons") and the we-mode we-reasoning that the individual members engage in. To plug this new gap Tuomela posits a supervenience relation (p. 73) between the group's intention and that of the we-mode of at least some of its members.

Here, as elsewhere, the notion of supervenience in play is somewhat opaque; a label stuck on a problem in the absence of an actual solution to the problem. At any rate, the problem at hand is that of explaining how two processes of reasoning, one an 'as if' process undertaken by an 'as if' collective agent/reasoner, the other a real process undertaken by real individual human members of a group, are supposed to connect. Here it should be borne in mind that the connection in need of explanation involves a 'meeting' of two like processes, viz. reasoning processes, that are in need of integration on pain of being disconnected in the manner in which the reasoning processes taking place in two distinct human minds are disconnected. Supervenience, as postulated, seems inadequate to this task. Rather than supplying the required explanation, it simply consists in the gratuitous announcement that "Every change in the group's intention . . . is necessarily accompanied by some change in the we-mode intentions of at least some members of the group" (p. 72).

At this stage one might be forgiven for finding oneself inexorably drawn to the conclusion that we have here a pseudo-problem, which disappears as soon as we jettison the idea of 'as if' collective agents/reasoners and their 'as if' processes of reasoning and associated 'as if' intentional states. After all, it is not as if (no pun intended) we have independently identified such collective agents, reasoning and attitudes, as we certainly have done in the case of individual human mental states -- the relationship of the latter to brain states being a primary reason philosophers contrived their notion of supervenience in the first place.

[1] Charles Taylor, Philosophy and the Human Sciences: Philosophical Papers 2, Cambridge University Press, 1985, pp. 187-210.

[2] Seumas Miller, Moral Foundations of Social Institutions: A Philosophical Study, Cambridge University Press, 2010, pp. 41-6.

[3] Peter French, Collective and Corporate Responsibility, Columbia University Press, 1984.

[4] The original notion of collective acceptance as fundamental to the construction of institutions and institutional facts was introduced by John Searle, The Construction of Social Reality, Penguin, 1995. Tuomela's account of institutions (Chapter 8) is derived from Searle's, albeit there are differences.

[5] Seumas Miller, 'Joint Actions, Social Institutions and Collective Goods: A Teleological Account' in (eds.) A. Konzelmann-Ziv and H. B. Schmid, Institutions, Emotions and Group Agents: Contribution to Social Ontology, Springer, 2013; and Moral Foundations of Social Institutions, op. cit., pp. 52-4.

[6] Ibid.

[7] Margaret Gilbert, On Social Facts, Princeton University Press, 1992, p. 162.

[8] Seumas Miller, Social Action: A Teleological Account, Cambridge University Press, 2001, pp. 151-9.

[9] Ibid.