Sociality and Normativity for Robots: Philosophical Inquiries into Human-Robot Interactions

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Hakli, Raul and Johanna Seibt (eds.), Sociality and Normativity for Robots: Philosophical Inquiries into Human-Robot Interactions, Springer, 2017, 267pp, $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9783319531311.

Reviewed by Robin L. Zebrowski, Beloit College


In March of 2017, a video of a small child standing in the street calling out to a broken water heater sitting curbside went viral on the internet. The water heater looked like a robot, with big saucer eyes and a cylindrical body, but only accidentally so. The child calls out to the robot and even when it doesn't respond, she hugs it and says, "I love you robot! I love you robot!"[1] What did we all love so much about this video? I'd argue it was the apparent social interaction between the child and the non-robot, a beautiful illustration of the ways in which people are often willing to engage non-intentional creatures or objects as social beings.

It should be noted, of course, that we don't need something to look like a robot (or animal, or creature at all) in order for children in particular, but also many adults, to engage with it as if they were engaging with a social being. After noting how many of my students still name their automobiles and treat them as intentional systems with agendas of their own, I once pasted googly eyes on the back of a chair for an entire semester in my artificial intelligence class, named the chair, and watched the students impose a personality and preferences on the chair over the course of the semester, simply because it appeared to have features only social beings tend to have. They began to include it in their considerations in the classroom, imagining what it might or might not desire, for example. What about these exchanges involves sociality? Does anything? There is an obvious epistemological versus metaphysical distinction to make here, and while it's easy to assume there is no being who is engaged in social behavior on the side of the "robot" or the googly-eyed chair, and we can know this pretty easily, there are definitely potential cases (if not any actual cases yet) where our epistemological limits prevent us from accessing the facts about a given potential social being.

This book sets out the project of doing just some of this background work on sociality, in order that we might not have to face constructed creatures designed for social interaction and wonder if they can engage with us on a genuine social level, or if they only appear to (acknowledging there are ethical implications for such a distinction from the outset, although the ethics are not really explored here at all). The stated goals in the introductory chapter don't entirely mesh with what I found in its pages, but it is worth exploring those goals briefly to make sense of the overall theme and project.

The editors offer this volume as contribution to what they call the new field of robophilosophy, which, they say, "aims to come to terms with the very idea of artificial social agency" (2). (I remain somewhat unconvinced that this new title is needed for work that largely seems to be cognitive science and human-robot-interaction, but I greatly look forward to watching this field emerge and carve out its space). The editors claim that social robotics is a new field that offers new opportunities to understand sociality, and they argue that inviting robots into our social world presents new sociocultural opportunities (3). This seems obviously true in one sense, but in another, we have always had artifacts that we treated as if they were social beings, even when we know they are not (and it is important to note that this claim carries with it enormous cultural baggage, since how humans interact with objects and apparent-subjects varies tremendously across cultures). Social robots do seem, at least, to be a tipping point in pushing the boundaries of what we might consider genuinely social, however, and this is one of the themes this book is concerned with. Importantly, the editors claim that this particular text is concerned with doing deep conceptual analysis of the sort normally confined to analytic philosophy, because, as they say, "researchers in analytic philosophy, and especially in social ontology, have yet to find their way into philosophy of social robotics" (3). This is worth noting for two reasons: first, because I was initially skeptical of their claim that so much of this work is mostly done from a continental perspective, explicitly not engaged by and in analytic philosophy (3), and, second, because much of this text turns out not to be doing analytic conceptual analysis of the sort they set out to do. This doesn't keep the volume from being valuable, however, and there is much to appreciate here.

It might have been useful for this book to be split into two sections: the first half as background conceptual analysis for sociality itself, and the second half as much closer to those cultural and social analyses (from the continental perspective) that the editors claim have already been staked out elsewhere. Again, there is good work here, but the promises made in the introduction did not meet the expectations in the text, and I worry that means the book won't find its audience.

The early chapters, in particular those by Johanna Seibt, Mark H. Bickhard, and David Eck and Alex Levine, are all indeed doing conceptual analytic work about how we should understand sociality itself. One prominent strength of this book is that each of those chapters on sociality seems to begin from a process metaphysics, rather than the historical particle- or substance-style metaphysics that is more common in analytic philosophy. Some (all?) of this is explicitly Bickhard's influence, and anyone who does work in artificial intelligence ought to welcome and embrace this work as it offers so many solutions to traditional problems in AI. Bickhard's chapter, in particular, is a good primer on his work in this area, and how embracing process ontology offers potentially non-controversial understandings of emergence and sociality itself. Eck and Levin further draw on process metaphysics to argue that interaction is prior to individuality and sociality, drawing also on the literatures on enactivism. Again, this is valuable work, but it is engaged in literatures around the concepts of alterity, autopoiesis, and participatory sense-making, which may be less comfortable to the analytic philosophers that I believed to be the audience of the book. These early chapters, engaged as they are in the foundational conceptual analysis of sociality, barely touch on applying any of this work to social robotics, leaving instead promissory notes that this work must be undertaken elsewhere. I find this realistic, given the depth and length of the chapters, but also unfortunate, as these early chapters are most promising on delivering the kind of analysis the book undertakes, but, apart from Seibt's chapter, doesn't deliver in the actual context of robotics.

Seibt's chapter is unique insofar as it may be the only one truly engaged in the project that the introductory chapter sets forth. Seibt sets out to offer a "general conceptual framework for the ontological classification of human-robot interaction," and really does deliver on this promise. What she offers is language and tools to make sense of our water-heater robot or our googly-eyed chair: what she calls the "soft problem in the ontology of social robotics" (14). That is, "the problem of how to describe human-robot interactions, from a second-person and third-person point of view, given that our concepts for human social interactions as such are inapplicable" (14). She argues that rather than simply generating and populating new categories to use in social robotic interactions, we need a new framework for "simulated social interactions" (15). Importantly, she distinguishes between at least three different sorts of scenarios within social interactions: 1) make-believe (wherein X treats Y as if it were Z), 2) fictional interaction (wherein "X interacts with Y as if it were doing Z") and 3) socially situated interaction (wherein "X takes Y to count as Z") (16).

These are clearly delineated, and the payout of the analysis is that she argues we commit a category error when we believe we can ever interact with something "as if it were a person" (20). Instead, it seems, we must be committed to treating it "as a person," a distinction played out in detail over the entire chapter. What Seibt hopes to do, and does with fair success, is to put forth a new set of what she calls "conceptual tools for forms of non-reciprocal or asymmetric sociality" (21). In other words, she suggests a new framework for understanding social situations in which we cannot, for whatever reason, attribute full human intentionality to at least one member of the interaction. One enormous benefit of this work is that, whether she has generated conclusively such tools or not, she has argued well that they are needed, and has given a clear starting point for how we might reconceive of social interactions so that we can make sense of both social robotics and human-human social interactions through this conceptual framework. This chapter offers people thinking about social robotics, and sociality more broadly, much to work with.

One other chapter bears particular mention as a high point: Victor Fernandez Castro's "Mindshaping and Robotics." While I have not read the primary mindshaping literature that Castro draws on, I find his use of it persuasive here in offering an alternative to the more traditional mindreading and simulation views about how we understand the motivations of others in our social worlds. I appreciated this chapter because not only does it offer a view I was unfamiliar with (and perhaps those more deeply engaged in the social cognition literature have already accepted or rejected the mindshaping view), but it also thoughtfully applies this view to potential future paths in social robotics. The mindshaping view says, roughly, that "agents are mutually interpretable because they behave according to the same cultural patterns and rational norms" (125) rather than mindreading (in which we attribute rational beliefs like ours to other agents and analogize, or simulate their behavior mentally in order to understand how they will perform). An example given is that, rather than mindreading, "car drivers do not need to calculate other drivers' behaviors in mentalistic terms because their behavior is regulated by traffic norms" (125). While I hope to see more of this view (and to further examine its strengths and weaknesses in other contexts), it offers a clear a valuable application to social robotics, insofar as it gives us a way to both build and evaluate robotic systems that sidesteps the metaphysical minefield of asking whether they might even properly be said to ever engage in true social interaction (an other minds problem in action), because we can instead look to their history of learning cultural norms as a way of evaluating the interaction, much like we (may) do already with other humans.

The remaining chapters are not held together by quite the same glue as the early chapters, ranging from a fairly straightforward social scientific study applying Bickhard's interactivist approach to imitation learning (Jedediah W.P. Allen and Hande Ilgaz). This offers some nice insights but seems to be more or less experimental cognitive science of imitation rather than conceptual analysis at all, particularly of the sort related to social robotics. There are additional chapters on human-robot interaction (again, not the promised new field of robophilosophy that the introduction claims to deliver, but solid and important research nevertheless). One (by Aurelie Clodic, Elisabeth Pacherie, Rachid Alami, and Raja Chatila) offers a valuable architecture for joint action that is reminiscent of subsumption, while another (by Felix Lindner and Carola Eschenbach) offers an important way to think about affordances (of a sort) in designing robots and spaces for humans to interact with them. These last two chapters seem a bit out of place given the insistence on analytic philosophy as the entry point to this text, but they are clearly and importantly about social robotics, and so still of interest to readers of this book.

In general, anyone interested in the philosophy of social robots will find much here to chew on from a wide range of interdisciplinary approaches, including analytic and continental philosophies, process philosophies, experimental social sciences, and even design considerations for robotics. Even if there is no ideal single reader for every chapter, almost every reader will find something very valuable, and some of these chapters are set to be canonical with regard to rethinking our notions of sociality in the age of human-centered robotics.

[1] Referenced October 3, 2017.