Socially Extended Epistemology

Placeholder book cover

J. Adam Carter, Andy Clark, Jesper Kallestrup, S. Orestis Palermos, and Duncan Pritchard (eds.), Socially Extended Epistemology, Oxford University Press, 2018, 318pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198801764.

Reviewed by Joseph Shieber, Lafayette College


I know the way from my house in the suburbs of Philadelphia to Carnegie Hall in New York City. Okay, yes: practice (very amusing). The more promising route for me, however, is the one encoded in the GPS-enabled maps app included on my cell phone. I also know that the Seleucid Empire once stretched roughly from what is now present-day Turkey to Pakistan and Turkmenistan. I know that because I read it . . . somewhere, although I no longer recall where.

If you're like me, you know information like those little tidbits not because of information stored "inside your head" -- or at least not solely because of the information stored there -- but because of information located primarily outside of your body.

Traditional philosophy has largely treated the discussion of cognitive processes and mental states as taking place within the body of individual cognizers -- that is, "from the skin in". Since the publication of Clark and Chalmers (1998), much of the philosophical discussion of extended cognition centered around the question of whether mental states could include as constitutive components states of the world "from the skin out". This is the question of how far knowledge -- and other cognitive and mental states -- can be extended.

A second strand of discussion began largely in the cognitive science literature (see, e.g., Hutchins 1995), but has recently enjoyed uptake within philosophical discourse (for example in Huebner 2013; Shieber 2013; Shieber 2015; Tollefsen 2015). This discussion focuses on the ways in which cognitive tasks can be distributed through social processes -- processes involving multiple cognizers sharing out cognitive tasks and communicating their individual results, sometimes through complex communicative network patterns that arise without a central planner or control. It involves the question of whether -- and, if so, how -- knowledge or other epistemically significant states can result from socially distributed cognitive processes.

This latter question is the topic of the present volume of essays edited by J. Adam Carter, Andy Clark, Jesper Kallestrup, S. Orestis Palermos, and Duncan Pritchard that grew out of an AHRC-funded project entitled Extended Knowledge. It is a companion volume to Extended Epistemology (2018), by the same editors, which deals with the former question, that of how the notion of extended -- as opposed to socially distributed -- cognition intersects with issues in epistemology.

The essays are divided into two sections, one focusing on foundational issues and the other focusing on applications and extensions of theories of socially extended epistemology. The volume also includes a brief but helpful introduction that summarizes the essays and draws out connections among them.  In this review, I'll briefly discuss each of the essays and close with an assessment of the volume as a whole.

In "How Far Can Extended Knowledge be Extended?: The Asymmetry Between Research Teams and Artifacts," K. Brad Wray suggests that virtue epistemology may not be able to account for knowledge that relies on extended cognition. Wray targets, in particular, Pritchard's (2010) suggestion that knowledge that p requires both (i) that the knowing agent's cognitive success in truly believing that p must be attributable to the agent's cognitive abilities and (ii) that the knowing agent takes responsibility for the belief that p. Drawing on brief discussions of the work of scientific research teams (including Watson and Crick, CERN and Fermilab, and medical research), Wray suggests that none of those cases offer optimism that the members of such research teams satisfy both of the conditions required by Pritchard for knowledge.

Cathal O'Madagain's "Outsourcing Concepts: Social Externalism, The Extended Mind, and the Expansion of our Epistemic Capacity" discusses semantic externalism in light of the extended mind hypothesis. According to the semantic externalist, the meaning of at least some concepts employed by a given language user is fixed by the knowledge and beliefs of other users. Even if I do not know the difference between a beech and an elm, to use an example of Putnam's (1975), I can nevertheless use the terms meaningfully by deferring to the knowledge of, say, arborists. O'Madagain suggests that appealing to extended cognition can help to clarify two puzzling aspects of semantic externalism: (i) how a thinker could have thoughts about phenomena whose identification conditions the thinker herself doesn't grasp and (ii) why a thinker would ever employ semantic deference, when presumably it would be better, from the perspective of autonomous reasoning, to grasp the identification conditions of all of the phenomena about which one thinks.

A quick argument against the existence of collective beliefs goes as follows. Beliefs require representations. There cannot be collective representations. Therefore, there cannot be collective beliefs. In "Representations and Robustly Collective Attitudes", Jeroen de Ridder challenges the force of this argument. He does so both by questioning whether beliefs do in fact require representations, and also by suggesting that the hypotheses of extended and distributed cognition can in fact underwrite a notion of collective representations.

The term "extended cognition" would seem to assume a core notion of cognition -- the sort that takes place "from the skin in" -- that is then extended to encompass elements of the environment or additional agents beyond the cognizer herself. In "Mind Outside Brain: A Radically Non-Dualist Foundation for Distributed Cognition", Francis Heylighen and Shima Beigi suggest reasons for questioning this assumption. They appeal to an "action ontology", according to which cognitive states can be understood in terms of their effects within networks of processes. The result is a form of panpsychism, in which it may be appropriate to attribute desires, intentions, or sensations to non-organismic systems.

There is an influential view according to which, in order to act intentionally, the actor must have practical, non-observational knowledge that she is so acting. In "Practical Knowledge and Acting Together", Olle Blomberg suggests that this requirement faces insurmountable difficulties in cases of joint intentional action. Since, according to Blomberg, a theory of intentional actions ought to account for intentional actions performed by individuals as well as those performed by joint actors, he argues that the influential view that intentional action requires practical, non-observational knowledge is false.

In their pathbreaking, "Group Know-How", S. Orestis Palermos and Deborah P. Tollefsen draw out a number of fascinating considerations involved in extending the notion of knowledge-how from individuals to groups. As they note, since the appearance of Stanley and Williamson (2001) there has been a resurgence of interest in the analysis of individual knowledge-how. Palermos and Tollefsen's great service in their essay is to sketch how to extend this discussion to cases of group know-how, such as the performances of orchestras, athletic teams, or dance troupes.

In the final essay of the first section, Joëlle Proust introduces the idea of "Consensus as an Epistemic Norm for Group Acceptance". She notes that some of the epistemic norms widely taken to govern individual beliefs -- such as error monitoring and coherence monitoring -- are not present in group attitudes. For this reason, Proust suggests that acceptance under consensus is a better fit for the notion of a collective epistemic attitude. Indeed, she argues that consensual acceptance is the sole collective epistemic attitude, and that it is an attitude unique to collectives.

The second section addresses applications and extensions of the theory of distributed cognition. The first essay is Sabine Roeser's "Socially Extended Moral Deliberation about Risks: A Role for Emotions and Art". She notes that many of the debates about risky applications of science -- think of genetically modified foods or artificial intelligence -- often end in stalemate due to the complex scientific and moral issues involved. Roeser suggests, however, that expanding the notion of distributed cognition to include emotions might help to move these debates. She appeals to the widely-held view that emotions track evaluative properties, and points in particular to the ways that works of art can allow us to respond emotionally and imaginatively in considering artistic depictions of risky technologies.

Holly Arrow and Alexander Garinther focus largely on the case of collective reworking of recollections of the Rwandan genocide in "Thinking Together about Genocide: Socially Shared Cognition in Context". They provide a very useful discussion of collective memory, drawing on a wealth of psychological literature on socially shared memory.

Alessandra Tanesini's "Collective Amnesia and Epistemic Injustice" offers a useful theoretical underpinning for the issues raised in Arrow and Garinther's contribution. Tanesini discusses the mechanisms on which collective memory is based, and argues that -- as in cases of individual memory -- collective memory also depends on collective forgetting, which she terms "collective amnesia". She notes that, just as environmental and social supports (e.g., monuments, museums, others' recollections) aid in collective memory, those same structures also facilitate collective amnesia. Though necessary for collective memory, this collective amnesia carries a price. The phenomenon of collective amnesia leads to a form of epistemic injustice: those whose individual memories fall afoul of the collective amnesia suffer a loss of self-trust.

In "The 'Ontological Complicity' of Habitus and Field: Bourdieu as an Externalist", Georg Theiner and Nikolaus Fogle introduce the work of the French sociologist Pierre Bourdieu into the discussion of extended and distributed cognition. Fogle and Theiner note, in particular, that the central notions of Bourdieu's work, habitus and social space resonate strongly with externalist ideas. Habitus is a type of practical knowledge, involving dispositions that are both embodied and essentially dependent on the environment of the knower. Social space is the social environment in which individuals find themselves; a person's position in social space constrains the sorts of knowledge and actions that are possible for them. Fogle and Theiner conclude their survey of Bourdieu with a helpful discussion of particular ways in which Bourdieu's thought parallels current theories in epistemic externalist thought.

Paul R. Smart's thought-provoking "Mandevillian Intelligence: From Individual Vice to Collective Virtue" questions the common-sense assumption that the best way to contribute to collective cognitive performance is to boost the performance of the individuals within the collective. To combat this assumption, Smart introduces the notion of a Mandevillian intelligence, one in which individual-level epistemic vices (e.g., inattention, forgetting) can lead to improvements of epistemic performance at the collective level. At the very least, Smart's essay is a helpful reminder that we cannot simply predict the cognitive performance of groups by summing the cognitive capacities of their individual members (cf. Woolley et al. 2010).

The so-called "frame problem" in AI has to do with the challenge of describing an environment and the rules governing action on that environment in a language (such as first-order logic) suitable for instructing an artificial intelligence operating in that environment. The problem is that it is deceptively difficult to make explicit the rules that we take for granted when we interact with our environment. For example, suppose that I'm talking on the telephone in an office lit by a lamp. When my conversation is finished, I hang up the telephone. What happens to the lamp? For humans, the answer is obvious: nothing happens to the lamp. Hanging up the phone doesn't turn off the lamp. But an artificial intelligence doesn't yet know this; we would have to make this fact about lamps -- and phones -- explicit in the description of the environment and how it behaves. In "Solving the Frame Problem Socially", Harry Halpin traces the history of the frame problem in AI and draws connections to discussions of socially extended knowledge. He discusses how it is that search -- such as the use of an internet search engine to find relevant information -- can be understood as a form of the frame problem, and notes how current solutions to the challenge of providing useful internet search results rely on socially distributed cognition. In this way, the case of internet search provides an example of solving the frame problem socially.

As should be clear from the discussion of the individual essays, the authors discuss a wide range of topics. On the whole, the discussions are of a high to very high standard. Nevertheless, the volume suffers from certain limitations -- albeit ones that are perhaps unavoidable for this type of undertaking.

The most significant of these is that there is a substantial amount of overlap in the prefatory discussions in the individual essays. The well-known "Otto" case introduced by Clark and Chalmers, to cite merely one example, appears in a substantial number of the essays. This reduplication of effort presents at least two problems. First, the authors spend a fair amount of time rehashing information that readers might well have gained in other essays in the volume, thus wasting time that might have been spent detailing the more substantive and original aspects of the authors' contributions. Second, and relatedly, this sort of overlap makes it unlikely that readers will be interested in reading the volume cover-to-cover. Rather, it's more likely that readers will seek out a few essays of interest, or dip into the volume only occasionally.

With this in mind, I feel most comfortable recommending this volume to graduate students or scholars already working in the field. It will be a useful addition to library collections at research institutions with research strengths in epistemology or social cognition.


Carter, J. A., Clark, A., Kallestrup, J., Palermos, S. O., and Pritchard, D. 2018. Extended Epistemology. Oxford University Press.

Clark, A. and Chalmers, D. 1998. The Extended Mind. Analysis, 58: 7-19.

Huebner, B. 2013. Macrocognition. Oxford University Press.

Hutchins, E. 1995. Cognition in the Wild. MIT Press.

Pritchard, D. 2010. Cognitive Ability and the Extended Cognition Thesis. Synthese, 175: 133-151.

Putnam, H. 1975. The Meaning of "Meaning". In Philosophical Papers: Mind, language and reality. Cambridge University Press, 215-271.

Shieber, J. 2013. Toward a Truly Social Epistemology: Babbage, the Division of Mental Labor, and the Possibility of Socially Distributed Warrant. Philosophy & Phenomenological Research, 86: 266-294.

Shieber, J. 2015. Testimony: A Philosophical Introduction. Routledge.

Tollefsen, D. 2015. Groups as Agents. Polity Press.

Woolley, A. W., Chabris, C. F., Pentland, A., Hashmi, N., and Malone, T. W. 2010. Evidence for a Collective Intelligence Factor in the Performance of Human Groups. Science 330: 686-688.