Socrates against Athens: Philosophy on Trial

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Colaiaco, James A., Socrates against Athens: Philosophy on Trial, Routledge, 2001, 266 pp., $22.95 (pbk), ISBN 0-415-92654-8

Reviewed by Nicholas D. Smith , Lewis & Clark College


This book is intended to help general readers understand the arguments Plato gives to Socrates in the Apology and Crito, in part by situating them within their historical, cultural, and political contexts. Unlike most of what has been written about this subject, Colaiaco has steered clear of what has to most scholars seemed inevitable: a choice between condemning Socrates again, by upholding the verdict of the Athenian jurors, or condemning the jurors (and the prosecutors of the case, Meletus, Anytus, and Lycon), and thus, in effect, the entire Athenian legal system, of having condemned to death not only an innocent man, but (as Plato puts it in the last words of the Phaedo) a man who was “the best, the wisest, and the most upright of all those we have known” (Phaedo 118a). Plato’s works certainly have the tendency to make a choice between these two condemnations inevitable.

Following Hegel and others (about which, Colaiaco is admirably forthright—see 4-5), however, Colaiaco sees the trial of Socrates as “the result of a tragic collision between two defensible positions” (4): Socrates’ position is likened to those of Ajax (217), and Antigone (6, 187) in ancient myth, and to Gandhi, Thoreau, and Martin Luther King in modernity (189). Although I personally find each of these comparisons either strained or seriously misleading, what they are supposed to reveal, in Colaiaco’s view, is a Socrates who, precisely because of his superiority of virtue, reserved all final moral judgment to himself (a “law unto himself”—223), and thus refused to allow himself to be subject to any authority—including most importantly civil authority—other than divine authority. Athens, on the other hand, saw in Socratic “no-holds-barred” (and no-doctrines-beyond-critical-scrutiny) philosophizing a genuine threat to the survival of the city. Both points of view, in Colaiaco’s understanding, have some merit. The picture of Socrates, upon which this Hegelian balancing act is hinged, is developed carefully in the first ten chapters of Colaiaco’s book, which roughly follow Socrates’ three speeches in the Apology. In the eleventh chapter, however, Colaiaco confronts the Crito, in which we find Socrates refusing to escape from prison, explaining that to do so would be wrong because “one must obey the commands of one’s city and fatherland, or persuade it as to what is really just” (the famous “obey or persuade” doctrine—Crito 51b-c). Colaiaco recognizes that it can’t be that Socrates puts himself above the law, and also that Socrates counts himself as subject to the law.

How to escape this conundrum? Colaiaco’s answer to this is most disappointing: Socrates doesn’t really mean it, according to Colaiaco, when he pronounces the doctrine of obedience to Crito. Because, Colaiaco contends, Crito is “intellectually incapacitated” (199), Socrates’ old and dear friend is in no condition to follow proper logic. Unable to convince his friend by philosophical argument, Socrates “resorted to a characteristic political speech that his friend was capable of accepting” (212), putting a very high-sounding (but, according to Colaiaco, most un-Socratic) speech into the mouth of the personified Laws of Athens that served more adequately to persuade poor benighted Crito that Socrates must stay in prison and take the hemlock.

Something has gone wrong here. In Colaiaco’s view, rhetorical puffery turns out to be a better way to persuade at least some people of what Socrates is confident is the right view. If such a tactic was acceptable for use with Crito, why would it not also be acceptable to use on his jurors, whom he characterizes as putting him to death precisely because he insisted upon only speaking the truth in court, despite the fact that the future of his philosophic mission was at stake (see Ap. 17c, 38d-e)? Indeed, does this not actually serve to convict Socrates of “making the worse argument the stronger,” as his “first accusers” put it (which Socrates proclaims he does not do (Ap. 19b-c, 23d)? Moreover, the idea that Crito is such an unfit intellectual partner for Socrates leaves Socrates’ lifelong maintenance of their friendship inexplicable. And what are we to make of Socrates’ plain statement when he announces (in his own voice) at the end of the dialogue that he strongly believes the arguments that his old friend, Crito, is at a loss to refute (54b)?

Colaiaco is forced to reject as “irony” (212) so much of the Crito because what he finds there does not square with his view of the Apology. Colaiaco misinterprets the Apology, however, because he supposes that there are at least two instances in that dialogue in which Socrates signals a willingness to disobey legal authorities. One of these cases—where Socrates tells of when he disobeyed the command of those who overthrew Athens’ democracy (Ap. 32c-e)—Colaiaco understands as an actual instance of disobedience to legal authority: “The Thirty’s command was unjust, but legally valid under positive law” (164). Having long ago shown that there is absolutely no reason to regard the Thirty’s command as legally valid,1 I see no reason to rehearse the same points over again here.

But of course the most important text for Colaiaco’s reading is Socrates’ hypothetical vow to disobey the jurors if they offered to let him go on the condition that he gives up philosophizing (Apology 29c-d). Now, Colaiaco realizes that as a matter of legal fact, there was simply no way for an Athenian jury to stipulate such a condition. “Even though the court apparently did not have the authority to issue such an order, he [Socrates] wishes to make clear that nothing will stand in the way of his divinely appointed mission” (140). Not pausing to attend to the consequence of the legal fact—namely, that logically it places the hypothetical vow to disobey outside the scope of the “obey or persuade” doctrine of the Crito (since no such disobedience could, as a result, be disobedience of any valid legal command), Colaiaco rushes on to insist that it is nonetheless just obvious that what Socrates says here commits him at least in principle to disobedience of law. Colaiaco unfortunately misses the fact that only a few sentences before making this hypothetical vow, Socrates had reminded the jurors that he felt duty-bound to abide by the commands of his military superiors at Potidaea, Amphipolis, and Delium (28e), risking death (and thus the end of his “divinely appointed mission” in Athens) by so doing, without (implausibly) suggesting that his obedience had always been conditioned upon his own considered personal judgment of the rightness of whatever these generals happened to command. In fact, several times in the Apology, Socrates insists both that he must, and that the jurors must, obey the law in performing their functions in the court (see, for examples, at Ap. 19a, 35c). In all of these cases, Socrates certainly looks and sounds like he believes that one must always “obey or persuade” the laws of the state.

But Colaiaco is not the only scholar who has managed to read all of these passages and come away nonetheless convinced that Socrates would certainly break laws in his pursuit of his “mission.” Suppose we take this conviction a bit more seriously, then, despite the lack of textual support. Colaiaco says, “nothing will stand in the way of his [Socrates’] divinely appointed mission” (140). But this can’t be right. Does Colaiaco suppose that Socrates could (or should!), for example, forcibly restrain and kidnap some recalcitrant interlocutor, who might otherwise slip away from an unpleasant discussion with Socrates? Obviously not—and so Socrates’ pursuit of his mission plainly recognizes limitations. As I have said, he also seems prepared at least temporarily to set that mission aside (and in jeopardy) for military service. What else, we might reasonably wonder, could deter Socrates from his mission?

But couldn’t the Athenian Assembly simply pass a law against philosophizing? And if they did, surely Socrates would have disobeyed it!2 But it is not at all obvious to me that such a scenario really is conceivable in late 5th-century Athens. The Athenians might outlaw the kinds of “philosophizing” that Socrates’ accusers alleged he was guilty of—”scientific” speculation about “the things beneath the earth and in the heavens” (Ap. 19b, see also 23d). Socrates may well have actually lived in Athens when exactly this sort of law was in effect, at least for a time.3 But Socrates says that he does not engage in this sort of “philosophizing” (Ap. 19c). What he does do is to talk with people about justice and the other virtues, and all of the other “most important things” (Ap. 22d) about which he finds himself and others lacking in knowledge. The claim that Socrates would violate a legally valid law proscribing philosophizing must first provide an explanation of how such a law might be worded in a way that both makes such a law conceivable in democratic Athens and would also force Socrates either to violate that law, or to stop philosophizing in the way that he did. At any rate, Colaiaco never explains how this could be.

The most natural understanding of Socrates’ “obey or persuade” doctrine, I contend,4 simply establishes which individual or body is given the responsibility of making final judgments, when there is intractable disagreement between some members or political institutions within the state. In Athens’ democracy, if the citizen disagrees with some law or policy of the state, according to Socrates, the citizen is invited to persuade the state. If a citizen becomes sufficiently disgruntled, moreover, he can always simply pack his belongings and leave. But because the state is provided the final responsibility for judgments, if the citizen’s and state’s disagreements cannot be resolved by persuasion, the “obey or persuade” doctrine also puts the burden of any negative consequences of responsibility onto the entity that is given the positive responsibility to make final decisions. In other words, when the state commands a citizen to do something, and the citizen had no role in formulating the command, then if the judgment is an unjust one, the injustice that gets done is the state’s responsibility (and not the citizen’s)—even if, as part of the state’s command, the citizen is commanded into being the instrument of the state in carrying out the command. If this is right, then the very idea—which is fundamental to Colaiaco’s interpretation— that Socrates would suppose that he must disobey any law he supposed was unjust, lest he become infected with that injustice, is simply a mistake.

We do not, moreover, simply have to contest this issue on purely intuitional or theoretical grounds; for Plato’s dialogues actually provide us with two cases in which citizens become recruited as instruments of the state in carrying out unjust legal judgments made by the state. The most obvious of these, of course, is the case of Socrates himself, who assists the state in his own execution by lifting the poison cup to his own lips. In Colaiaco’s interpretation, it seems, by doing so Socrates became implicated in the jury’s injustice. I find it noteworthy—and wrong-headed—that Colaiaco says, “the philosopher chose to commit suicide” (217). Less often noticed is the case of Socrates’ jailor, whom we meet in the Phaedo (116b-d).5 Socrates’ jailor characterizes his prisoner as “the noblest, gentlest, and the best man who as ever come here” (116c), and although this may seem faint praise under the circumstances, the jailor goes on to note that he is only “obeying orders” (116c) and reassures himself that Socrates will not hold the jailor responsible for what he must do, but will understand that it is others who are really responsible (116c). After the jailor leaves, weeping, Socrates has kind words to say about the poor man, and notes that the two have had several occasions to converse during the time he was in prison (116d5-7). It is, as the jailor wished, quite obvious that Socrates does not blame him for carrying out his orders. We may even suppose that the jailor is personally entirely convinced that Socrates was innocent and—had justice prevailed—should have been acquitted. Nonetheless, Socrates was convicted and sentenced by the jury to be executed. The jailor was then ordered to oversee and carry out the execution. Saddened by the thought that an innocent person will be killed, the jailor nonetheless does as he was ordered by the court.

It is certainly true that Plato wants us to think that an injustice was committed in the execution of Socrates, and there can be no doubt that the jailor played a causal role in that injustice. It is also true that the jailor’s role was voluntary. He participated, knowing what he was doing. He was not coerced. It seems clear that he believed that the state had convicted and condemned an innocent person. Yet, it is plain that Socrates did not at all hold the jailor morally responsible for the injustice. If responsibility is to be placed rightly, it lies with the prosecutors, and with the jury members who arrived at the wrong decision. They are the ones who have been unjust. What this shows us is that willful, fully voluntary participation in an unjust act commanded by legal authority is not sufficient for saying that the agent has acted unjustly. This is all the “obey or persuade” doctrine requires, and there is nothing embarrassing or otiose about such a requirement, nor does it in any way conflict, as I have argued above, with anything we get—explicitly or even implicitly—in Plato’s Apology.

My frequent co-author and partner in Socratic studies, Thomas C. Brickhouse, is quoted on the back cover of this book as proclaiming, “Socrates against Athens is a welcome addition to the literature on Socrates’ trial and imprisonment.” Given the way in which Colaiaco manages to misconstrue several of the most fundamental doctrines and statements in Plato’s Apology and Crito, I find I cannot agree with my partner’s statement. There are already books available and in print that do not make such errors. It may be the best book available for general audiences, assuming that general audiences are incapable of reading more careful scholarship; but the same limitation, we must hope, does not apply to scholars themselves. And if general audiences do read and accept Colaiaco’s book, they will end up being misled and confused about much of what Plato has tried to show us in these dialogues. In particular, by denying that Socrates (and thereby, by implication, Plato) really accepts the arguments he puts into the mouth of the personified Laws of Athens in the Crito, Colaiaco’s book actually manages to defeat Plato’s purpose and to silence Plato’s philosophical voice in these most important pages.


Brickhouse, Thomas C. and Nicholas D. Smith. 1989. Socrates on Trial. Oxford University Press and Princeton University Press.

Brickhouse, Thomas C. and Nicholas D. Smith. 1994. Plato’s Socrates. Oxford University Press.

Brickhouse, Thomas C. and Nicholas D. Smith. 2000. The Philosophy of Socrates. Westview Press.

Kraut, Richard. 1983. Socrates and the State. Princeton University Press.


1. In Brickhouse and Smith 1989, 173-193Although Colaiaco cites this work in some of his notes, he makes no response to it in making his claims about the command of the Thirty.

2. See, for an example of this sort of claim, Richard Kraut 1983, 13-17.

3. The psephism of Diopeithes, under which Anaxagoras was prosecuted in 430 B.C.E., apparently made such activities illegal. Some scholars, however, have doubted that reports of this-and of the trial of Anaxagoras-were historically reliable. For discussion, see Brickhouse and Smith 1989, 32-33.

4. The general view I merely sketch in what follows is explicated in much greater detail in Brickhouse and Smith 1994, 141-155 and Brickhouse and Smith 2000, 200-216.

5. I am indebted to Chris J. De Marco for calling my attention to this case.