Socrates and Philosophy in the Dialogues of Plato

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Sandra Peterson, Socrates and Philosophy in the Dialogues of Plato, Cambridge University Press, 2011, 293pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521190619.

Reviewed by Eve A. Browning, University of Minnesota Duluth


Did Plato hold a Theory of Forms? Does Socrates in the middle and later dialogues of Plato act as Plato's 'mouthpiece'? Did Plato endorse an authoritarian state ruled by philosophers and watched over by guardians who get kisses for courageous fighting? Did Plato advocate censorship of the arts? Did he present his Socrates as committed to the immortality of the soul in his last earthly philosophical conversation?

The answer to all of these questions is no, according to Sandra Peterson. In this book, which will afford readers the unsettling opportunity to rethink almost every conviction they might hold concerning Plato, Peterson argues that the Platonic corpus should be read as a consistent representation of the one unified Socratic mission of eliciting ideas from interlocutors and testing those ideas. Overall the book is meticulously argued, attentive to the texts, gracefully written, and presents a refreshing perspective that challenges many orthodoxies in a way that is itself quite Socratic.

Beginning with a close and careful reading of the Apology, Peterson develops a Socrates who knows only that he has no 'big knowledge' (22), and is assured by the Delphic oracle that no one else has any either. He has been throughout his life on fire with a sense of mission: to elicit, via questioning, the pretensions to knowledge of his peers, to examine their commitments, and to inquire together with them once their claims collapse. Peterson then follows this Socrates through several texts which are usually understood as advancing substantive (Platonic) doctrines: the famous 'digression' of the Theaetetus describing the philosopher, the Phaedo's arguments for immortality, and the toughest challenge of all, Republic. In all these important locations, she finds that Socrates elicits and perhaps riffs upon the convictions of his fellow conversants, but does not commit himself (nor should one commit Plato) to any philosophical positions -- other than the value of the process, the seeking.

My hypothesis is that the Socrates in any of Plato's dialogues is examining his interlocutor and so engaging in the central component of the complex activity, philosophizing, which Socrates calls in the Apology his habitual activity throughout life. (4)

This examination has several components or stages: first, the interlocutor must be "revealed". Socrates tailors his speaking style to different conversation partners, and might often seem to be advancing a position of his own: "Socrates as depicted realizes that appearing to enunciate doctrine, and observing his interlocutor's receptivity to it, is the best way of revealing" (5).

A principal target for Peterson's case is the so-called "grand hypothesis", associated with Gregory Vlastos but shared by many, according to which Plato's early dialogues present mostly Socratic views and mid-to-late dialogues present mostly Platonic views. This general position, not original to Vlastos but famously argued by him, has been so influential that, in some form or other, it can almost be taken for orthodoxy.

As initial motivation for her hypothesis, Peterson offers four considerations:

  1. There is a lot of question-and-answer in especially the early dialogues, and it does not there commit Socrates to any specific 'big' views.
  2. We know that "Plato's logical acumen is substantial" (8), yet some of the arguments usually taken to support substantive doctrines are terrible.
  3. Many of the terrible arguments and the views to which they lead would not withstand the kind of questioning Socrates directs at interlocutors on any given dialogic day.
  4. Plato wrote dialogues in which he does not appear; this suggests that he is "reluctant to make pronouncements as an authority who is certain about what he recommends" (11).

Having established (in chapter 2 on the Apology) a Socrates who resists the appellation "wise" and commits only to inquiry, Peterson in chapter 3 applies her hypothesis to the Theaetetus' 'digression' (Tht. 172-177), a lengthy description of the philosopher and the philosophic life which has challenged and divided readers due to its extreme claims.

Peterson first connects this dialogue to the Apology via the Euthyphro, the dramatic date of which is shortly after that of the Theaetetus. The Euthyphro in turn precedes the Apology in dramatic time, since it announces the lawsuit against Socrates which will lead to his execution. This proximity in dramatic date Peterson takes to indicate that the Socrates of the Apology is very much still in view. She then argues that the interlocutor at the digression-point in the dialogue is the mathematical Theodorus,

It turns out that the philosopher in the digression -- who can't find his way to the agora, doesn't notice his neighbors, "never condescends to things at hand", and is as if suspended at a height gazing down upon the world -- is a reflection of Theodorus' views on philosophy, not Socrates' or Plato's. Theodorus is the one who has a disregard for the world and the neighbors, and who gives an unusually "hearty assent" (71) to the Theaetetus' odd and distinctly non-Socratic portrait of the philosopher.

Why does Theodorus' view of the philosopher, absurd though it may be, take this position of prominence in the dialogue and go unquestioned? Peterson suggests that the conversation is for Theaetetus' benefit, as he is young and so promising, and that Socrates hopes to return to the conversation at a later date. I will return to this strategy with a query, below.

Peterson then turns (chapters 4-5) to what I thought to be the biggest challenge to her hypothesis: the massive and sprawling Republic, with its city and soul construction projects, its intricate analogies (Sun, Line, Cave), its reach even into the afterlife where souls drink the water of forgetfulness and return to try again. Can Plato's Republic plausibly be viewed as an "extraction" from its young interlocutors Glaucon and Adeimantus? She begins by stressing that on any 'straight' substantive-doctrine reading, the Republic has not been easy to love. From its commentators various aspects of it have elicited reactions such as "'altogether peculiar', 'philosophically frustrating', 'seriously flawed', 'very ugly', 'risible absurdity', 'too hasty and too crude', 'embarrassingly bad', 'botched', 'outlandish'", and much more (90).

This chapter proceeds by acknowledging what almost all readers of the Republic notice: that book I seems quite different from books II-X. The Socrates of book I is the "questioning, avowedly ignorant" familiar Socrates many find in the early dialogues; but something happens to him in Book II that triggers an extended exercise in city-building, metaphysical flights, social engineering, political taxonomies, and more. Should this be read as the departure of Plato from his mentor?

No again; Peterson argues convincingly that the most influential and indeed decisive difference between the two parts of this great work lies in Socrates' mode of participation. In book I, he has been engaged in a patterned question-answer exercise triggered by Cephalus. In the remainder of the work, after Glaucon's explicit request to be "persuaded" that justice is better, from the inside so to speak, than injustice, Socrates will deliver a lengthy persuasive speech. The character of that speech and its contents are both tailored to the requests of Glaucon and Adeimantus to be so persuaded without attention to justice's outward effects, but solely on its intrinsic qualities. The details of the persuasive speech, its content, are tailored to the young men's characters: "A speech-maker who persuades a listener reveals what at the moment appeals to the listener to believe" (102). The "city in words" may be described by Socrates, but it is thoroughly owned by the approving audience and tailored to their ambitions and desires.

It is Glaucon who protests that the simple city with which Socrates begins is "a city of pigs", it is he who demands relishes and luxuries, and it is he who embraces the necessity of war which then drives the script for the remainder of the book. "Socrates gives very frequent reminders that an initial assumption of the discussion is that the city is carefully prepared for warfare" (111, followed by a lengthy list of passages noting the city's capacity for warfare).

The Republic's portrait of the philosopher-king, including education, preferred activities and interests, appropriate topics of study, and corresponding metaphysics, is shown to be both perfectly suited to the personalities of young men who are luxury-loving elitists and snobs, and also incoherent and fraught with internal tensions (chapter 5). Peterson suggests that Glaucon has some association with Pythagorean ideas, and that these drive some of the intuitions of the more transcendental passages; quoting Burkert, she notes that combining "the hypnotic spell of the religious with the certainty of exact knowledge" produces a powerful appeal and "would help to explain Glaucon's and Adeimantus' receptivity to many of Socrates' suggestions" (157).

Pythagorean ideas also underlie the more transcendental passages of the Phaedo (chapter 6), in which Socrates is again nudged into giving a persuasive speech -- this time about the nature of the soul. Phaedo is the narrator, and the narration occurs at Phlius, a "locus of Pythagoreanism" (166). Phaedo is telling the story of this conversation to Echecrates, a Pythagorean community member. Simmias and Cebes, the main interlocutors, have been studying with Philolaus, a known Pythagorean (167). The other-worldly notes in the conversation, Peterson argues, are designed to resonate with young men who lean that way. Socrates is once again revealing his interlocutors but not necessarily himself, even unto the last minutes of his life.

Nor does Plato reveal himself in his works (chapters 8 and 9). Peterson finds Plato's motivation as a writer hinted at in an anecdote from Plutarch. "And everyone ought to be ready ever to repeat to himself, as he observes the faults of others, the utterance of Plato, 'Am I not possibly like them?'" (16). When Plato depicts Socrates creating castles in the air out of materials drawn from the souls of his interlocutors, he is implicitly asking, "Am I not possibly like them?" He has internalized the true Socratic mission of eliciting and testing, along with Socrates' conviction that none of us is really very well off with regard to Big Knowledge. Peterson's Plato is perhaps something of a skeptic, and she takes comfort in this since there have been other interpreters of Plato (some ancient) who read him this way; she does not want to be alone under the sun with this reading (233).

The book overall is extremely well-argued and its readings subtle and sensitive. The picture which emerges is that of a writer (Plato) who disappears in his text, just as his mentor Socrates disappeared into the arguments suggested to him by others. I am not entirely comfortable with this disappearing Plato. Socrates rarely gets past the eliciting stage in any extant dialogue; we seldom see how the testing process would go. Is the implication of this book that Plato spent his entire writing life on a philosophical project that never delivers? A lengthy series of propaedeutics to philosophy, rather than any result? Peterson says we, Plato's readers, must do the work of testing; she gives some examples of how this might go. But would not Plato himself have been sorely tempted to give it a shot? Once he has, with great expense of effort, constructed the massive hot air balloons of Republic (if that is what they are), could he really just walk away without sticking in even one little pin? His writing enterprise becomes a curious one, of impersonation so good that many if not most readers have been fooled for millennia. The famous "footnotes to Plato" become a massive epidemic of mistaken ascription.Peterson is aware that the removal of substantive commitments from Plato's works threatens them somewhat, and includes (chapter 8) an argument that Plato must still be regarded as a creative genius of the first rank. After all, he outlines the interlocutors' foibles with a delicate touch, and his Socrates is endlessly energetic in the eliciting and as it were hypertexting of their innermost thoughts and dreams.

Peterson also meets the argument that Aristotle seems to have believed Plato had substantive views (he attacks them as such), and wouldn't Aristotle have been in a position to know? Her view is that Aristotle seems to have known Plato's ideas mainly through the dialogues, and therefore he is like most other readers who fall for the 'mouthpiece' hypothesis. I find this somewhat troubling, since in their long association it is hard to believe that Plato and Aristotle would not have talked about writing philosophy and how it is best done.

These worries aside, Peterson's book has the potential to be a true game-changer in ancient philosophy, and its overall argument should be attended to by all who have the ever-complicated pleasure of being puzzled by Plato's works and unsettled by his Socrates. The book will in its turn unsettle some very widely shared orthodoxies. We too will have to ask, "Am I not possibly like them?" Like Socrates himself, Peterson invites us to have our accustomed views elicited and questioned. The result is a book that every serious reader of ancient philosophy will find important and compelling.