Socrates' Daimonic Art: Love for Wisdom in Four Platonic Dialogues

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Elizabeth S. Belfiore, Socrates' Daimonic Art: Love for Wisdom in Four Platonic Dialogues, Cambridge University Press, 2012, 304pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107007581.

Reviewed by Frisbee C. C. Sheffield, Christ's College, Cambridge University


In the Symposium Socrates claims to know nothing except things about eros (177d). In the Phaedrus he claims to have an 'erotic art' (257a). Since Socrates professes ignorance in many dialogues, these claims are puzzling. It is not obvious what knowledge about eros consists in, where Socrates uses this erotic art, or how this use is compatible with his ignorance. Belfiore addresses these and related questions in this book. The aim is to illuminate the nature of Socrates' erotic art and in doing so

to shed light on a number of important dramatic and philosophical issues, including: the relationship between eros and philosophy, the interconnection between the love of wisdom and interpersonal love, Socrates' treatment of his interlocutors and their responses to this treatment; the relationship between Socrates' claims to have knowledge, or wisdom, about ta erotika (erotic matters) and his recognition of his own lack of wisdom (xi).

Since it has become commonplace to refer to 'Plato's erotic philosophy', it is worth exploring with Belfiore whether there is any substance to this description and what it consists in. The relationship between Socrates and eros was longstanding, and in certain Platonic dialogues the association between eros and philosophy is strong. But if eros is central to Plato's conception of philosophy in some dialogues, why does it fade from view in others? How erotic is this conception, and what do we mean by 'erotic' in this context? If eros refers to a broad desire for good things and happiness (e.g., Symp. 205df.), a desire whose highest expression is the desire for wisdom (210df.), then a deflationary construal of Socrates' expertise is that it consists in knowing something about the nature and aims of human desire (happiness), and the kinds of things that best satisfy it (wisdom). Aristotle might make similar claims for himself in the Nicomachean Ethics, but we don't call him an erotic expert. Perhaps Plato (unlike Aristotle) uses eros as his general term for the desire for the good because eros played a central role in the education of the young in certain social circles in the period that concerns Plato in the dialogues (a context which lost its relevance for Aristotle). Plato provides some of his fullest accounts of the good in those dialogues concerned with education, so adapting eros terminology is appropriate in this context. Belfiore acknowledges the importance of the erotic-educational context (10-11, 22), but she is after something more. She argues persuasively that eros is more than a background context or incidental theme; eros is at the heart of Plato's characterization of philosophy in four works, the Symposium, the Phaedrus, the Lysis, and Alcibiades I.

According to Belfiore, 'all of these dialogues are erotic in that they depict Socrates as practicing an art or skill that is itself erotic because it shares certain characteristics attributed to the daimon Eros in the Symposium' (3). In itself this is not particularly helpful since it is to say that Socrates' art is erotic because it has characteristics Plato associates with eros in his story about eros personified as a daimon (202e-204c). The issue is why these characteristics are appropriate to Plato's philosopher. Belfiore first specifies the key components of the erotic art, and then substantiates them by exploring their operation in her quartet. She specifies five components (6, summarized below):

  1. Socrates claims to be under the patronage of, or devoted to, Eros and ta erotika: the wisdom, beauty, and other good things that are the objects of the passionate desire (eros) that is the sphere of this god or daimon.
  2. He recognizes that he himself lacks wisdom and other good things.
  3. Under the influence of eros he has a passionate desire for the wisdom and other good things he recognizes that he lacks.
  4. He is marvelously skilled (Symp. 198d) in the search for as much wisdom and other good things as he can attain.
  5.  [He] is also skilled at helping others to acquire erotic art; i.e., to recognize their lack of wisdom, to desire it passionately, and to become skilled in seeking to attain it.

Belfiore is surely right to use the Symposium to illuminate Socrates' 'erotic skill'. This work provides the fullest treatment of eros and an extended parallel between Socrates and Eros in Alcibiades' speech. Belfiore is also persuasive when she argues for the importance of the story about Eros as a daimon. It claims to illuminate the nature of a lover (204c), culminates in the claim that Eros is a philosopher (204b, this appears briefly in Belfiore's introduction, 3), and offers insights into the philosophical character by describing certain characteristic features, for example, how aporia and euporia (roughly, 'lack' and 'resource') interact in the search for wisdom. Belfiore also persuades that components (1) -- (5) are operative in her quartet. The nature of these characteristics is more controversial.

Socrates' 'marvelous skill' (component 4), for example, resides in his technique of question and answer; Belfiore's dialogues 'make frequent use of a pun on eran ('to love') and erotan ('to question')' (16). Though 'question and answer' fits the skill employed in Lysis (e.g., 210e) and Alcibiades I, it is not clear how this counts as interpreting the divine, or 'binding the whole together', also key features of the 'rites' and practices used by the daimonic character in her key passage (202e-203a). This makes one wonder about what grounds the choice of key components. More puzzling, perhaps, is that this 'marvelous skill', though dominant in the Lysis and Alcibiades, is different from the new skills for seeking wisdom employed by Diotima in the Symposium and the ideal rhetorician in the Phaedrus -- knowing how to ascend to forms, or knowing how to divide things according to kinds. These are both practices and 'rites' explicitly linked to the divine, and they can be understood as ways in which the divine world of intelligible forms, and that of mortal particular things, is 'bound together' by the daimonic character.

Belfiore resists giving Socrates such robust methodological skills (204). To do so would threaten the unity of her quartet, and give Socrates more knowledge than she allows. Socrates is 'always in a state in between wisdom and ignorance', and aware of his lack of wisdom (component 2), - even about 'erotic matters' (146). She cites the fact that Diotima only persuades Socrates of these insights, and concludes that he has true belief, not understanding, about them. Erotic expertise for Belfiore is compatible with Socrates' ignorance, but at a price. The erotic art turns out not to be a techne properly speaking (though it shares the goal of pleasing the gods), but a skill based on experience not knowledge (13, 16, 207); knowledge about erotic matters is not knowledge proper either, but true belief. Belfiore's focus on component (2), awareness of ignorance, does a good job of explaining one way in which Socrates is in between wisdom and ignorance, familiar from dialogues like the Apology, but one wonders whether this can accommodate the focus on aporia and euporia in the Symposium. If 'marvelous skill' consists in a technique of question and answer, which typically generates awareness of ignorance, then the wisdom in relation to which Eros/Socrates is resourceful seems to be the human wisdom of the Apology. 'Marvelous skill' in searching for forms, of the sort had by Diotima, or the ideal rhetorician of the Phaedrus, belongs to a different kind of techne for Belfiore (207f.).

Much of Belfiore's argument proceeds by showing us that, as an erotic character, Socrates has characteristics shared by Eros the daimon: he is aware that he lacks wisdom (component 2), and is skilled in searching for it (component 4), for example. The question is why these characteristics are depicted as erotic (component 1). Other philosophers might subscribe to component (2), and consider desire important, insofar as searching for wisdom involves setting after something, but this will not be characterized as a form of eros. What is the relationship between eros and philosophy? Belfiore claims that 'when we love something and recognize that we do not possess it, we ask questions about this object and attempt to find out how to acquire it. That is, loving leads people to like wisdom: philo-sophein' (154, 83).

This is puzzling. I love chocolate cake, I am aware I lack it, and I think about how to get it; I acquire extensive knowledge of ingredients and so on. This does not lead me to pursue wisdom in a philosophical sense. To substantiate the claim that eros has some relationship to philosophy, not just to some reflective activity, much of which will have a tenuous relationship to philosophical activity -- requires specifying the sense in which wisdom is, or can be, an object of eros. Here, I think, there is a gap in Belfiore's argument where Socrates is uncharacteristically explicit. He provides one of the very few explicit arguments in the Symposium for the claim that Eros is a philosopher (204b). The argument runs as follows: if something is perceived to be beautiful, then Eros desires it; wisdom is perceived to be beautiful; therefore Eros desires wisdom. Further, wisdom is desired because it is one of the most beautiful things (204b2-3). So, Eros is concerned with the beautiful; the more beautiful an object the more Eros desires that object; wisdom is one of the most beautiful objects; therefore Eros is most especially a lover of wisdom. Socrates thinks it follows from the fact that eros is that part of desire specifically related to beauty, and wisdom is amongst the most beautiful things, that philosophy is an important activity of eros.

What seems to be important here is that one recognize the beauty of wisdom, for it is only by recognizing it as beautiful that one will set after it, and do so in the relevant way. One won't set after it in the sense in which one might want to get a bit of cake (cf. Agathon at Symp. 175d1). Seeing wisdom as one of the most beautiful things means that one will set after it in a very particular kind of way: one will see it as something intimately connected to eudaimonia (Symp. 205d), and this will manifest itself in creative pursuits designed to secure that end (206b). By arguing that eros is the appropriate response to wisdom, Plato seems to suggest that wisdom is the kind of good that should be valued in a certain kind of way; having eros for wisdom is a mark of one who does not just 'carry the wand', but values it as something that makes life 'worth living'. One of the ways in which Socrates' art is erotic, properly speaking and not just in some 'transferred' sense (9), is that he makes people see the beauty of wisdom; for all eros is concerned with the beautiful (206e). In doing so he encourages others to value wisdom in a certain kind of way -- to make it a dominant value in their lives, and see it as something intimately connected to their eudaimonia (216a, 222a). As a result they are encouraged to make the transformative changes begun by Aristodemus and felt, though resisted, by Alcibiades. As the Symposium displays so masterfully, seeing the beauty of wisdom, or the beauty of the works and deeds of a Socratic character, inspires a particular kind of valuing, and eros, for that wisdom whose pursuit constitutes the philosophical life for Plato. That is one reason, perhaps, why loving the kalon is central for Plato, and why eros continues to play a role in his conception of philosophy beyond Belfiore's quartet (see e.g., Phaedo 66e; Republic 499b).

For Belfiore what ultimately explains the centrality of eros is not the relationship between the kalon and wisdom, or the importance of valuing wisdom in a certain kind of way, but Plato's adapting the erotic-educational conventions of the day, exploiting the association of eros with the mysteries to suggest that education is an 'initiation into the mysteries of Socratic eros' (22), and utilizing the youthful passion of men like Alcibiades, Lysis and Phaedrus (10, 22-5). She argues that the interlocutors in her quartet are young and passionate, unlike those in the 'trial and death dialogues' (Apol., Phd., Euth.); associating philosophy with eros is a way of transforming this passionate intensity productively (22-3). Whilst Belfiore persuades that these aspects are relevant to an appreciation of eros, it remains to be shown why such passionate intensity, rather than a spirit of sober reflection, is appropriate to philosophy, or why philosophers should be erotically inclined towards wisdom beyond their youth (Phaedo 66e; Republic 499b).

Belfiore does highlight beauty in her focus on the kind of beauty -- psychic beauty -- that grounds beneficial interpersonal relationships (e.g., 54-6, 177-9, 233-5). One of the most persuasive sections of the book is Belfiore's exploration of the importance of establishing mutually beneficial interpersonal relationships. Belfiore argues that Socrates seeks wisdom by examining himself and others by means of question and answer, dialectic, which is a 'non-competitive and mutually beneficial activity, which requires, and helps to create, friendly relationships among the interlocutors.' She gathers together a range of material to show that 'goodwill, affection or love . . . makes dialectic possible' (63). If so, love will have a central role in Plato's conception of philosophy. Whilst questions remain about how close this connection is (e.g., Is dialectic always interpersonal? If so, why?), Belfiore contributes to a range of debates here. First, she shows how an eros for wisdom might be compatible with interpersonal relationships by creating the conditions for their development. Second, her reading of the Phaedrus (chapters five and six) explains how it differs from the Symposium in its emphasis on the combination of eros for wisdom with friendship (198). Finally, her focus on the importance of establishing 'mutually beneficial interpersonal relationships' contributes to the discussion between those (e.g., Vlastos  and Beversluis) who argue that Socrates has a negative impact on his interlocutors, and those who argue for positive results beyond the explicit conclusions reached in the discussion (21).

This book made me want to go back to the texts, aware of how much more there is to understand about eros, and with new directions for further inquiry. In that sense Belfiore exemplifies many of the virtues of Socrates' erotic art.