Socrates' Divine Sign: Religion, Practice and Value in Socratic Philosophy

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Pierre Destrée and Nicholas D. Smith (eds.), Socrates' Divine Sign: Religion, Practice and Value in Socratic Philosophy, Academic Printing and Publishing, 2005, 192pp, $26.95 (pbk), ISBN 0920980910.

Reviewed by Nickolas Pappas, The City University of New York


Ten papers from a conference on Socrates' daimonion (Brussels 2003) assess what is known today about that piece of the Socrates puzzle and debate a range of still unsettled issues. The chapters are written by Luc Brisson, Mark L. McPherran, Gerd Van Riel, Thomas C. Brickhouse and Nicholas D. Smith, Pierre Destrée, Roslyn Weiss, Mark Joyal, Michel Narcy, Louis-André Dorion, and Aldo Brancacci.

The Socrates depicted in Plato's dialogues spoke of a daimonion signal that came to him. That word daimonion is an adjective meaning "daimôn-ish" -- divine, or maybe what the English of earlier centuries called "weird."

Anyway the sign came as some kind of voice and Socrates claimed to have heard it since childhood. It was apotreptic rather than protreptic, never commanding Socrates to act some way but only making sure he heard the discouraging word whenever he chanced to embark on a harmful action (Apology 31d).

Xenophon's Socrates heard a somewhat different voice, one that did not hesitate to endorse one action over another. Plato consistently presents an inhibiting divine agent.

Xenophon and Plato agree however that the divine sign of Socrates needs specially to be discussed in connection with the trial at which Socrates defended himself with such famous unsuccess. In Plato's account of the trial, Socrates remarks on having heard no spooky peep that day either on his way to the courts or during his (impromptu, haughty) defense speech. He accepts the news of his death sentence with equanimity and even good cheer on the grounds that since the daimonion did not stop him, the death that will follow his behavior must not be a bad thing (Apology 40a-c).

(Xenophon offers a variation on this last argument but likewise depicts the divine sign practically speeding Socrates along to a happy death.)

As far as the Platonic Socrates is concerned, Plato's Apology contains all the essential general information about the divine sign. Other mentions occur in five dialogues: Euthydemus, Euthyphro, Phaedrus, Republic, and Theaetetus. There is also the Alcibiades, not widely accepted as a genuine work of Plato's, and the Theages, not at all considered genuine. The additional mentions amplify or illustrate what the Apology says, so that for Plato's readers the daimonion amounts to a couple of odd characteristics touched on in two handfuls of passages.

For the past half century the topic of Socrates' divine sign has been mostly neglected, whether because there is so little evidence to go on or because the subject of religion embarrassed Plato's commentators. After all, Socrates was committed to rationality. If that sign he received were real it would have had to be compatible with what his reason told him. No point treating it as something besides the voice of reason.

The present volume exists however because the daimonion question will not remain on the sidelines of Socratic scholarship. For the same reason, Nicholas D. Smith, one of this volume's co-editors, was also recently a co-editor of another collection that covered somewhat similar ground: Smith and Paul B. Woodruff (eds.), Reason and Religion in Socratic Philosophy (Oxford University Press, 2000).

Impossible to figure out or not, the divine sign is relevant to the larger picture of who Socrates was and what he did. Was the man in fact what moderns call rationalistic? Did his commitment to reason make him an atheist?

Also: Given that only Socrates appears to have heard a divine signal, did Plato see him as something unique, or was his life instead a possibility available to all humans? (Does one only philosophize with a daimonion?)

More broadly: Why was Socrates tried and executed? In what way and for what reasons did his experience of his divine sign lead to his conviction and death?

Because Socrates cannot be understood until his weird voice has been, the first priority is therefore to determine what that voice is and how it works. The ancient testimony is not incomprehensible and not all that contradictory, but it does pose questions that have not yet been treated with the thoroughness they deserve, certainly not given definitive answers.

For example: What kind of experience was Socrates referring to with words like "a voice"? Who sent that message? Did it wear its meaning on its sleeve or did it stand in need of explanation? Is "No" all it said?

One can grow suspicious too. Why did Plato and Xenophon take special pains to talk about the sign and what it did or didn't say in their respective versions of the trial? Maybe they had thought of Socrates as magically protected by his infallible warning system, only to watch as he stumbled heedless into the viperous courtroom, where the plain talk that had humbled and elated Athenians in the agora merely offended the jurors. Had they been wrong about the sign and was Socrates just an ordinary man? If that anxiety goaded Plato and Xenophon, their complicated appeals to the sign and explanations of why Socrates saw his death sentence as a happy ending may have been after-the-fact rationalizations for the voice's apparent failure.

These specific questions about the voice and its message occupy the contributors to Socrates' Divine Sign. The eleven authors sift through the available Platonic evidence for new insights about the divine sign, hoping to use what they learn to understand Socrates.

What divides the authors of these articles, as is only appropriate, are the contentious issues surrounding the divine sign -- whether the sign comes from a god or rather speaks from within Socrates; whether it attests to Socrates' uniqueness among humans or on the contrary makes him a paradigm for all others to follow. With plenty of space for the positions on both sides of these debates and others, the collection brings its reader up to date on a thriving and significant discussion.

Perhaps philosophers who do not study ancient philosophy will find the anthology too focused. And despite perennial interest in Socrates, the microsurgery with which the authors dissect these passages almost guarantees that the general reader will not come to the book, or not persevere with it. Still it will have its influence. Almost everyone who teaches Plato and Socrates in college is bound to be operating under assumptions about the daimonion that articles in this collection challenge. Those scholars ought to read this book; having read it they will surely speak of Socrates in new ways. It is good to have such a book available.

Moreover it is good to know that such a book can come out today, a heartening sign of the times bespeaking welcome change in studies of ancient thought. For thirty years or more the serious assessment of Greek religion has made ancient beliefs and practices look worthier of study than they had been. The names of Walter Burkert and Jean-Pierre Vernant are only the most prominent of many in this enterprise. Still philosophers have a hard time responding to fifth- and fourth-century Athenian thought as other than the work of "free-thinkers." You can blame Thucydides and his role as every modern's guide to the fifth century: Thucydides with his impatience for oracles can make Socrates' Athens seem as atheistical as a philosophy department in America today.

But Socrates was not a man in the Athenian crowd enslaved by intellectual fashions of the day. The Platonic Socrates talked about hearing and heeding dreams (Apology, Crito, Phaedo) and about obeying the Delphic oracle (Apology, Republic); he spilled wine to Zeus in the Symposium. In several other dialogues (Ion, Phaedrus) he attributed poetry to divine inspiration. The voice he heard was part of a life that included divinity, and theories about Socrates will be incomplete if they pretend otherwise.

Thus when Thomas Brickhouse and Nicholas Smith refute Gregory Vlastos's reductionist reading of the divine sign -- the voice as a rational hunch -- they are helping to bring a suppressed side of Socrates back into the picture (44-49). Socrates' experience was genuinely religious -- which as Brickhouse and Smith also point out does not make it irrational (61-62).

Mark McPherran too has worked to expand the prevailing interpretation of Socrates' rationality. It stands to reason that he should be part of this book: He played a major role in the Smith-Woodruff volume, and his own The Religion of Socrates (Pennsylvania State University Press, 1996) argued at length for the compatibility between Socrates' piety and his philosophical enterprise.

McPherran is a typical contributor in some ways, for these tend to be widely recognized names in Socrates-studies, knowledgeable and clear-thinking but also imaginative scholars. He stands out in one respect that is worth drawing attention to: He keeps himself apprised of contemporary research into Athenian religion and incorporates his research into his assessment of Socrates.

Although McPherran's book contains the most numerous examples of how he uses knowledge about Greek religion, there are some here too. His article in Socrates' Divine Sign vivifies references to the voice by exploring it as a relationship between Socrates and Apollo (26-30). McPherran juxtaposes Socrates' trust in dreams to the skepticism Aristotle voices in On Divination in Sleep 464a, to offer some cultural lens through which to see Socrates (13-14). These are hardly detailed inquiries into Greek religion, and yet they exceed what one finds in the book's other articles. Most proceed without reference to how Socrates' contemporaries practiced their religion and especially without reference to what recent research into the subject has discovered.

To put the point another way: It is true that all claims about the Socratic divine sign have to rest on fewer than a dozen passages. But reviewing these few passages can have the effect of excluding questions about the background of classical Athenian religious practice. Only a few phrases in this book even allow room for consideration of the religion of the day (e.g. 31-32, 62, 72, 85, 109, 148). More often than not such mentions only raise more questions.

Take Pierre Destrée who writes of the scholarly consensus that Plato does not want to confuse the divine sign "with some traditional religious way of considering a daimôn as a personal guardian" (62). Destrée later resists this consensus, invoking "the popular view of the daimôn as attached to each person from birth" (72); either way he contents himself with sparse and ambiguous references where the discussion would profit from detail. Just what tradition or popular view of the daimôn does he mean?

For well before Christianity arrived the Greeks could think of a daimôn as a source of malevolent activity. See most generally Burkert, Greek Religion (Harvard University Press, 1987), 180-81. In Odyssey 5.396 illness is a "hated [stugeros] daimôn," while Pindar with superstitious indirection refers to an "other daimôn" (Pyth. 3.34). Indeed the "good daimôn" to whom Aristophanes' characters pour propitiatory libations (Knights 85, Wasps 525) may only have been called agathos as a euphemism, part of the effort to placate him.

Even if the evidence for malevolent daimones does not preponderate over references to "personal guardians," the existence of that evidence opens up the question of what Socrates might have been alluding to, or how he might have been heard by his contemporaries. It should not go without saying, as it is permitted to here, that Socrates' language drew on "traditions" about personal helpers.

In another paper Gerd Van Riel emphasizes the privacy of the divine sign, and rightly so. The political import of Socrates' "religiosity" must indeed have to do with his privileged access to a moral touchstone removed from anything his fellow citizens say.

But again there is an appeal to "tradition" whose vagueness allows only diffuse light to fall on Socrates. "The link between Socrates and his daimôn is absolutely exclusive, which is never the case when it comes to the intervention of traditional divinities" (35). Never? Van Riel cites no evidence for this assertion (though his sentence sounds as if it could have come from Robert Garland: See Introducing New Gods [Cornell University Press], 149). It would have helped to know, Private as opposed to what? This worry about an exclusive link "to the personality of the recipient" (35) needs to be fleshed out with the help of particular contrasts.

What about oracles, for instance? In Socrates' time it was increasingly individuals who solicited their judgments, Delphi's earlier prediction that Persia would triumph having damaged the oracle's credibility among governments (Burkert 116). Doesn't the divine message to a private client count as an exclusive intervention?

Or consider this personal touch. Before Socrates the Pythagoreans spoke of daimones whom they -- and evidently no one else -- could see (Aristotle, frag. 193). What's the difference between that and Socrates' exclusive access to his daimonion voice? Van Riel's focus on privacy surely has to be right, but his cause is not helped by generalizations about Greek practice.

An article by Asli Gocer in the Smith-Woodruff anthology had already warned against categorizing Socrates' "religiosity" in the absence of better evidence about Athens as a whole ("A New Assessment of Socratic Philosophy of Religion"). To call Socrates a nonconformist, says Gocer, one needs much better historical information about what he would have been conforming to (123-125).

Gocer could go further. Not only where Socrates stood by comparison with his fellow Athenians, but even what they understood him to be saying to them, remains indeterminate in the absence of a distinct picture of his fellow citizens' religion. When Socrates uses the adjective daimonion, he presumably wants to communicate something about the message he has been getting. So what is it? What is daimonion in pre-Platonic Athens and how is it spoken of?

The history of Greek religion will never substitute for scrutiny of every Platonic passage that mentions the divine sign. The contributors to this anthology are right to bring tough questions to bear on the passages they cite. Asking questions has not ceased to be the philosopher's job.

But if the philosopher is bent on hearing an answer, the historian of philosophy is meanwhile trying to overhear a distant answer to a now nearly inaudible question. This is where the study of religious practice comes in. To make out what the Athenians were muttering to each other or what Plato said back to them, today's eavesdropper needs to know how the conversation had already been going before Socrates ever arrived to join it.