Socrates on Self-Improvement: Knowledge, Virtue, and Happiness

Socrates Self Improvement

Nicholas D. Smith, Socrates on Self-Improvement: Knowledge, Virtue, and Happiness, Cambridge University Press, 2021, 182pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781316515532.

Reviewed by Nicholas R. Baima, Harriet L. Wilkes Honors College, Florida Atlantic University


When faced with anything painful or pleasurable, anything bringing glory or disrepute, realize that the crisis is now, that the Olympics have started, and waiting is no longer an option; that the chance for progress, to keep or lose, turns on the events of a single day. That’s how Socrates got to be the person he was, by depending on reason to meet his every challenge. You’re not yet Socrates, but you can still live as if you want to be him.

Epictetus, Enchiridion 51.2–3, trans. Dobbins

For Plato’s Socrates, happiness (eudaimonia) requires virtue, and virtue requires knowledge. Unfortunately for the non-divine, the Socratic dialogues do not present an optimistic outlook regarding the human pursuit of happiness. Socrates’ quest for the knowledge of virtue is replete with failure. Famously, Socrates denies understanding what virtue is and seeks out experts who profess to know. But, alas, the alleged experts can’t provide an account that withstands elenchos, or cross-examination. We, the readers, are in a precarious situation: we are told that in order to be happy, we must become virtuous, but we aren’t given concrete advice on how to do that (see Benson 2013b). Moreover, if virtue eludes Socrates, “the best, the wisest, and the most upright” of people (Phaedo 118a), what chance do chumps like myself have? Such thinking has led some scholars to argue that Socrates actually believes we are better off dead (Ch. 6; Jones 2013, 2016; cf. Apology 40c–41a; Crito 47d–48a; Gorgias 507c; Phaedo 64c–66d, 82e–83a; Republic 1.353e–354a; Christensen 2020).

Before contemporary followers of Socrates start drinking hemlock at the first sign of apparent divine permission (Phaedo 62c), we should hear out Nicholas Smith, who offers a far more optimistic interpretation: on his reading, we all can make genuine progress toward virtue and thus achieve a degree of happiness. Smith’s interesting and insightful book asks readers to reconsider how they understand Socratic knowledge. Smith argues that we are led astray when we think of Socratic knowledge as being sentential or propositional (“knowledge-that”) (see also, Smith 2019), rather than as being craft-like (“knowledge-how”). Propositional knowledge is binary—you either have it or you don’t—while craft knowledge is gradable—you can have more or less of it. If we think of Socratic knowledge as propositional, then the inability to provide a sound definition places knowledge of virtue and thus happiness beyond human reach. But if we think of it as something you can be better or worse at, like riding a bike, then we can have some share of it and thereby have some degree of happiness.

The craft knowledge reading affords several interpretative advantages. For starters, it naturally explains why Socrates would use crafts as an analogy for virtue. It also helps explain how Socrates is both an exemplar of virtue, which is a kind of knowledge, and yet still ignorant: since knowledge comes in degrees, Socrates could be smarter than the average bear, but less than a divine being. In addition, thinking of knowledge as gradable explains why Socrates would exhort us “to become as wise as possible” (Euthydemus 286a). If knowledge is an all-or-nothing achievement, then it becomes difficult to make sense of this favorite passage of Smith’s.

However, Socrates’ search for the knowledge of virtue seems to be a search for the definition of virtue, and definitional knowledge seems to fit something like the propositional model better than the craft-like model. After all, the Socratic method seems to involve asking purported experts of F what F is. Hence, it appears that, for Socrates, a necessary condition for knowing F is knowing the definition of F (see Benson 2013a). Smith argues, however, that definitional knowledge isn’t always a feature of craft knowledge in Socrates’ discussions. When Socrates and Callicles discuss expertise in swimming, definitional knowledge doesn’t seem relevant (Gorgias 511b–c). Smith writes, “So does Socrates believe that the epistēmē (knowledge, expertise) or technē (craft, skill) of swimming consists in the ability to say what swimming is? Obviously not: one might know perfectly well what swimming is and not be able to swim” (14). That said, Smith notes that “Socrates does seem to think that if someone really were a master of the craft of virtue, that person could explain what the virtue is and teach others how to obtain it” (15).

If we concede that people with lesser craft knowledge of F might not be able to explain F, and people who have mastered F can explain it, then what becomes of the distinction between true belief and knowledge (Meno 98a)? After all, this distinction seems to hinge on the person with knowledge being able to give an explanatory account, and this explanatory account is operative in the division between knacks, which aim at persuasion, and crafts, which aim at knowledge (Gorgias 465a). And, if knowledge comes in degrees, how can we make sense of Socrates’ claim that it is always true (Gorgias 454d)? By no means are these irresolvable problems; rather, they are an invitation to say more about how Socratic craft knowledge relates to these ideas.

After providing an explanation and defense of Socratic craft knowledge, Smith unpacks what moral improvability looks like. Chapter 2 does so by explaining Socrates’ claim that he has taken up the true craft of politics (Gorgias 521d). For Smith, this amounts to more than Socrates having the mere ambition to become wise; it involves actually acquiring some degree of wisdom (cf. Shaw 2011). Chapter 3 connects epistemology to moral psychology by exploring Socrates’ claim that no one voluntarily acts wrongly but only does so out of ignorance. In exploring this idea, Smith develops an affective account of belief formation. He explains how non-rational states—fear, shame, anger, etc.—affect the development of belief, and since all wrongdoing results from ignorance, these non-rational states can shape us for better or worse. Chapter 4 expands upon the work in Chapter 3 by clarifying Socratic ignorance and elenchos. Smith explores Socrates’ epistemic modesty and how it can shape ethical improvement, as well as how we can make decisions from the standpoint of ignorance (see Baima and Paytas 2021).

Chapters 5 and 6 link the craft knowledge interpretation to happiness. Chapter 5 examines whether virtue is sufficient for happiness, and Chapter 6 whether it is necessary. With respect to the sufficiency claim, Smith argues that virtue is sufficient for doing well but not for happiness. While it is true that Socrates treats these as equivalent in the Euthydemus, Smith worries that our conception of happiness has a higher standard than the one Socrates had in mind. To illustrate this point, he provides the example of “Sully” Sullenberger, the commercial pilot who performed an emergency landing on the Hudson River, saving all 155 people on the flight. Though “We may well imagine that Sully was relieved that no one died that day [. . .] no one—and certainly not Sully—would have described his condition as a ‘happy’ one. Even so, he did well that day” (107). As such, if we treat them as equivalent, we are not only likely to misunderstand Socrates’ account, but we are also likely to underappreciate how we are vulnerable to external circumstances.

Also, in this chapter (which is my favorite), Smith develops an account of Socratic harm and human vulnerability. This isn’t an easy task since Socrates seemingly excludes normal “harms” from his account. According to Socrates, to harm someone means to make them worse off with respect to virtue (Republic 1.335b–c). This is why a worse person, someone like Anytus or Meletus, cannot harm a better person, someone like Socrates, even if they kill him (Apology 41c–d). Smith argues, however, that there are ways in which external factors can make us vulnerable to becoming vicious. We could, for instance, be corrupted morally through bad teaching and parents.

Smith’s Socrates is far more humane and reasonable than he is often taken to be, which is appealing, and no doubt Socrates is sensitive to the ways in which individuals can be corrupted through improper teaching or even illness. For example, in the Republic, Socrates says, “But I am afraid that, if I slip from the truth, just where it’s most important not to, I’ll not only fall myself but drag my friends down as well [. . .] for I suspect that it’s a lesser crime to kill someone involuntarily than to mislead people about fine, good, and just institutions” (5.451a–b). And in the Phaedo and Gorgias, he notes how our embodied state poses various limitations on our ability to reason correctly (Baima forthcoming).

Though I am sympathetic to what Smith says here and believe that parts of it accord with the text, I have lingering doubts. Socrates seems to emphasize the ways in which virtue inoculates us far more than the ways in which we are vulnerable to external factors. In fact, much of the debate between Socrates and Callicles seems to be about this very issue. Callicles warns Socrates about how his neglect of public opinion makes him vulnerable to death and the inability to protect those he loves, and Socrates responds by telling him that the only thing worth protecting is the quality of one’s soul. Accordingly, I’d suggest that rather than thinking that virtue isn’t sufficient for happiness, we should recognize that external factors can affect whether and to what degree we are virtuous. This would allow us to maintain the claim that the virtuous are immune to harm and to make sense of how we can still be vulnerable to external circumstances, as these circumstances can hinder or help our cultivation of virtue. 

With respect to the necessity claim, Smith argues that virtue is necessary for happiness, but we shouldn’t understand this as an all-or-nothing concept (ch. 6). Hence we are left with a more positive account of the Socratic mission—one in which we can make genuine progress toward virtue and happiness. Smith defends this reading by carefully dissecting passages from the Apology and by exploring how Socrates thinks about craft expertise.

 After explaining and defending his craft interpretation of Socrates, Smith concludes by examining the philosophical merits of his view. Smith begins by noting that charity—interpreting a text in a plausible way—is “only a relatively minor desideratum,” for it is not the job of “scholars to ‘rescue’ some historical figure from some error they plainly make. We might reasonably speculate about how that figure could have avoided that particular error, but charity certainly cannot trump the obvious sense of the text” (159). Of course, Smith is correct that if we are doing scholarship, and the text clearly says X, we shouldn’t make it say Y just so our beloved philosopher doesn’t look foolish.

However, this oversimplifies the matter. Seldom is it the case that making sense of the text is straightforward—if it were, it wouldn’t require interpretation. Careful readers will notice that key parts of Plato’s writings are in tension with each other, and some statements of the characters are puzzling. In trying to make sense of these tensions and puzzling passages, scholars need to rely on what is philosophically plausible. Of course, Smith is correct that scholarship shouldn’t rescue the philosopher being studied at all costs and that we can separate the question of (a) whether X is the correct view of a philosopher from (b) whether X is the correct view. However, in doing (a), some amount of philosophical analysis is required to make sense of the ideas, and this will involve some amount of considering what is plausible, or charitable. For instance, defending the interpretative claim that Socrates has in mind craft knowledge not only requires looking at Socrates’ description of crafts but what would plausibly fit within those descriptions (consider the quote above about swimming). Indeed, some of the perceptive and important scholarship in this book is deeply informed by Smith’s astute philosophical abilities.

Leaving aside this interpretative quibble, the afterword is an honest exploration of the plausibility of Socrates’ view divorced from any consideration of interpretative adequacy. The discussion is refreshing, and I wish more philosophers of ancient studies were willing to engage in similar conversations. It is, of course, valuable to know what Socrates and Plato meant, but it is also beneficial to see whether it is true or useful. One important reason to study Socrates and Plato is that they have something valuable to contribute to contemporary philosophical problems.

Socrates on Self-Improvement: Knowledge, Virtue, and Happiness examines the most important questions in Socrates’ philosophy, providing keen insights and positing new challenges to commonly held interpretations. In particular, graduate students and scholars of ancient philosophy working in the analytic style will greatly benefit from Smith’s careful exegesis and incisive philosophical analysis. More generally, we all stand to benefit from “the Socratic view that we will become better people to the degree that we take up his quest ‘to become as wise as possible’ (Euthydemus 286a)” (165).


Baima, N. R. Forthcoming. “The Ethical Function of the Gorgias’ Concluding Myth.” In J. C. Shaw (ed), Plato’s Gorgias: A Critical Guide. Cambridge.

Baima, N. R. and T. Paytas. 2021. Plato’s Pragmatism: Rethinking the Relationship Between Ethics and Epistemology. Routledge.

Benson, H. H. 2013a. “The Priority of Definition.” In J. Bussanich and N. D. Smith (eds.), The Bloomsbury Companion to Socrates. Bloomsbury, 136–155.

–––––2013b. “What Should Euthyphro Do?” History of Philosophy Quarterly 30: 115–146.

Christensen, A. 2020. “As the God Leads: The Ethics of Platonic Suicide.” Ancient Philosophy 40: 267–284.

Epictetus. 2008. Discourses and Selected Writings. Trans. R. Dobbins. Penguin.

Jones, R. E. 2013a. “Felix Socrates?” Philosophia 43: 77–98.

–––––. 2016. “Socrates’ Bleak View of the Human Condition.” Ancient Philosophy 36: 97–105.

Plato. 1997. Plato’s Complete Works. Eds. J. Cooper and D. S. Hutchinson. Hackett.

Shaw. J. C. 2011. “Socrates and the True Political Craft.” Classical Philology 106: 187–207.

Smith, N. D. 2019. Summoning Knowledge in Plato’s Republic. Oxford.