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George Rudebusch, Socrates, Wiley-Blackwell, 2009, 221pp., $26.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781405150866.

Reviewed by Raphael Woolf, King's College London



In this book Rudebusch gives a lucid and engaging account of the philosophy of Socrates. Of course “philosophy of Socrates” is now something of a term of art, generally covering the content of a certain group of favored works of Plato (or parts thereof) that are thought to capture the spirit (if not the letter) of the historical Socrates. Rudebusch is rightly keen to emphasize the philosophical value of that content rather than its historical accuracy. Indeed one of the more refreshing aspects of his approach is his desire to look at the dialogues from what he calls an ‘existential’ rather than an ‘academic’ point of view — that is, as containing themes that might actually be of vital importance for us today in our quest to live a good human life.

Equally refreshing is Rudebusch’s refusal to play down the radical nature of some of Socrates’ theses — for example, that all the virtues are identical and amount to a kind of knowledge, and that such knowledge will bring us happiness. He is, moreover, keen to show that Socrates is able to provide compelling arguments for his positions, and that therefore they are ones we must take seriously. Overall, then, particularly for readers relatively new to these works (and, it must be said, for those not so new but a little jaded with an overly ‘academic’ approach) this is likely to prove an exciting and companionable volume. Rudebusch has an appealing voice — that of the intelligent, committed advocate — well suited to his material and to the aims of the ‘great minds’ series of which it is a part.

In some ways the book is quite conventional. Its view of which of Plato’s works are to be regarded as ‘Socratic’ basically adheres to those dialogues that Vlastos influentially classified as early or transitional. This kind of classification goes back ultimately, albeit indirectly, to Aristotle’s testimony, of which Rudebusch has a brief but judicious discussion (204-6). But there is a certain tension in Rudebusch’s approach. If the objective is to give an account not of the historical figure ‘but the great mind in the text’ (xv) then why restrict oneself to those parts of the text deemed most historically faithful? If, on the other hand, historical veracity is one’s aim, it is unclear (without at least a bit more defense) why Plato’s reports of Socrates should be privileged over those of, say, Xenophon, who only gets brief mention. In a volume of this nature there is perhaps a limit on how much time can be spent on such methodological issues. But given Rudebusch’s primary aim of explicating the Socrates we find in Plato’s works one might have hoped for something a little more satisfying in terms of Plato’s own art than the rather tired separation of one figure representing ‘a portrait of the historical Socrates’ (204) from another who, as ‘a mouthpiece for the views of Plato himself’ (ibid.), can be safely set aside when Socrates is the topic.

Once one has identified one’s favored works, with the attendant awkwardness of treating, say, Republic Book 1 (as Vlastos did and as Rudebusch does) as essentially a separate Socratic dialogue, one identifies one’s favored themes. Here too Rudebusch is to some extent conventional. Theses such as the so-called Unity of Virtue (not a term Rudebusch himself employs) and the sufficiency of knowledge for happiness have received microscopic analysis from scholars over the years. But it is a tribute to Rudebusch that he succeeds by and large in conveying the sense of strangeness and challenge that these indeed radical positions should still have for us. Welcome also is Rudebusch’s emphasis on the religious aspect of Socrates (still rather underplayed in contemporary scholarship despite the sterling efforts of some) and on the centrality of love to Socrates’ outlook. I found the distinction Rudebusch draws between ‘needy’ and ‘giving’ love as applied to the discussion of the Lysis an illuminating one, though not all of Rudebusch’s nomenclature is quite so happy. Rendering the Greek dikaiosunē as ‘righteousness’ rather than the more usual ‘justice’, while certainly in this instance unconventional and consistent with the religious dimension, had the effect, for me, of obscuring rather than clarifying the sense of that term, though others may disagree.

What should we make of the radical theses that Socrates delivers? As with any philosophical position, the credence to be given to them must depend in large measure on how convincing we find the arguments adduced in their favor. So we must face the question of what to make of Socrates’ arguments. Here, I think, Rudebusch draws something of a false dichotomy. He speaks (xii) of those readers who think there are obvious objections to the arguments, in which case we must regard Socrates as either having failed to see how poor his arguments were, or as putting them forward merely in jest. Or we must regard the objections as surmountable, so that contrary to appearances the arguments turn out to be compelling. Rudebusch takes the latter option, but he seems to have missed a viable alternative, which one might call the dialectical approach. Take the purpose of Socrates’ arguments to be not to propound a particular philosophical position, but to show that his interlocutors’ own thoughts on important issues are muddled and confused, and that they therefore need to devote considerably more critical attention to those thoughts than they have hitherto done.

As Rudebusch is of course aware (it forms a significant part of his account) this is pretty much how Socrates describes his own mission in the Apology — the revealing to others of their unwitting ignorance. Why should we, then, suppose that Socrates is at all interested in expounding what Rudebusch calls on p. 98 ‘moral theory’, especially given that Socrates is so insistent himself in the Apology that he lacks knowledge about moral matters? It is, I confess, a surprise to me that one such as Rudebusch, who signs on to the idea that certain favored dialogues are ‘Socratic’ — works which tend to end in perplexity and to be characterized by Socrates’ awareness of his ignorance — should treat the establishment of a moral theory on Socrates’ behalf as an interpretive desideratum.

Moreover there is a danger on this approach that one ends up tying oneself in knots, and I don’t think Rudebusch entirely escapes this. For example, having taken the Unity of Virtue to be a tenet of Socratic moral theory, he then has to explain why in the Laches Socrates seems to hold as fixed that bravery is merely one part of virtue. Rudebusch’s response is that this reflects a Socratic policy of using deliberate false leads (see in particular his Chapter 7, ‘puzzling pedagogy’) to expose an interlocutor’s mental confusion. But now we have a rather ungainly combination: a figure who has a radical moral theory and compelling yet contentious arguments to support it, but who uses not these but a bunch of false assertions when actually working on an interlocutor. This, it seems to me, does not add up. If Socrates has radical positions to which he is committed and supporting arguments that are already apt to bamboozle, it seems both insincere and wasteful to peddle deliberately false lines instead. Of course one can argue that putting forward a hypothesis such as that bravery is (merely) a part of virtue, which an interlocutor is likely to accept, is dialectically more effective in exposing mental confusion than offering a more exotic thesis. But then it seems to me that the whole idea of false leads is beside the point. One’s aim is to show that the interlocutor assents to ideas that are not mutually consistent — something must be wrong and it is the task of further examination to discover what. But the falsity of a particular proposition, let alone the questioner’s taking it to be false, is neither here nor there for the purposes of such a dialectical venture.

One might nevertheless have independent reason for thinking that Socrates does subscribe to particular moral tenets. One of the key exhibits for Rudebusch in this regard is the Protagoras, where Socrates certainly might be taken to be advocating in his own name the thesis that all of human excellence is to be identified with a kind of knowledge. On the other hand, the context is dialectically tricky, more so, I think, than Rudebusch acknowledges. The discussion concludes in puzzlement, with Socrates imagining the personified argument asking how Socrates can maintain that virtue is not teachable and yet is a kind of knowledge, while Protagoras maintains the converse. So it is prima facie unclear that Socrates ends the dialogue regarding “virtue is knowledge” as an unproblematic tenet of moral theory, or that it should be he rather than Protagoras who ought to espouse it.

Moreover when it comes to one of the main supporting planks for this would-be tenet, namely the argument that knowledge is sufficient for right action (that akrasia is impossible), there is rather less commitment expressed by Socrates than Rudebusch suggests. On one of the very few occasions that Rudebusch’s rendering of the Greek may mislead the reader (his translations are on the whole excellent), he claims (44, 63-4) that at Protagoras 352e5-6 Socrates proposes ‘to teach the world’ what the phenomenon regarded as akrasia really is. But what Socrates actually urges here is that Protagoras ‘try to teach’ (epicheirēson didaskein) people about it, albeit with Socrates’ help (met’emou). So even where Rudebusch thinks he can find a straightforward statement of a position, the actual wording is, as so often with Socrates, less committal and more dialectically subtle than that. In light of his overall approach, it is surprising that Rudebusch chooses not to give the Gorgias, where I think it is arguable that at times we do get something like the setting out of a Socratic position (with a fierce urgency to boot), a chapter to itself, while the more nuanced Protagoras and Laches earn two each.

That said, one of the joys of studying Plato’s Socrates is that one never quite succeeds in working out what he is up to. Although I have expressed some doubts about Rudebusch’s reading of Socrates as a moral theorist, the experience of this book will be joyous for many readers, as it was for me. Rudebusch’s advocacy of Socrates as a thinker who has much to tell us about the good human life is carried off with passion and grace, as well as an enviable succinctness and clarity. It is a treatment that I expect will succeed, deservedly, in winning over new advocates.