Socratic Moral Psychology

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Thomas C. Brickhouse and Nicholas D. Smith, Socratic Moral Psychology, Cambridge University Press, 2010, 276pp. $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521198431.

Reviewed by Alfonso Gómez-Lobo, Georgetown University/Catholic University of Chile


The central claim of this book is that the character called "Socrates" in the early Platonic dialogues (EPDs) does not hold the doctrine known as "Socratic intellectualism." According to this doctrine moral and/or prudential failure in human action is not to be explained by reference to the agent's appetites or passions, but rather by reference to some cognitive failure. Thus, incontinence (akrasia), or weakness of the will, is impossible. The doctrine is clearly attributed to Socrates by Aristotle, and Aristotle also makes it clear that he thinks it is false (p. 64).

How do Brickhouse and Smith (B&S) make their case? First, they spell out what they take to be some of the background assumptions of a "Socratic philosophy" in the EPDs (p. 40): "prudentialism", "interest as an objective standard", "the relation of desire to objective interest", "Socratic eudaimonism" (pp. 43-49). Then, B&S discuss a certain number of passages in Plato asking whether these are consistent with the proposed interpretative thesis or with that of their rivals (pp. 50-192). The book has a final chapter on Socrates and his intellectual heirs (Plato, Aristotle and the Stoics), at the beginning of which we find a useful summary of the authors' position (pp. 193-247). An appendix examines the relationship between the Gorgias, especially its eschatological myth, and the EPDs.

The book opens with a defense or "apology of Socratic studies" (pp. 11-42) that is logically independent of the rest of the work. The assumption the authors make (and some scholars reject) is that in the EPDs there is a coherent body of "Socratic philosophy" (p. 40) that deserves to be inquired into and formulated. However, as long as no claims are made about the historical Socrates (pp. 39-40, 193), it seems to me unnecessary to defend such a research project. Its outcome, of course, could end up being that what the EPDs contain is "proleptic Platonic philosophy" (after Charles Kahn), but in either case Plato is the thinker we are trying to understand and such an endeavor surely requires no justification.

Do B&S succeed? It is hard to tell. The discovery in the EPDs of a passage depicting an instance of "synchronic belief-akrasia", i.e., of action opposed to what the agent believes at the moment, such as the Leontius vignette in Rep. IV (439e-440a, cf. pp. 205-209), would certainly clinch the argument, but no such passage seems to exist in the EPDs. Near the middle of the book B&S clarify their position as follows:

In our version, Socrates should continue to be understood to hold that everyone always desires what is good for them and that everyone always acts in the ways they think is best for them. But, we have argued, there are potentials within the soul that have aims other than what is truly beneficial, such as appetites that aim only at pleasure. These potentials function by representing their aims to the soul as benefits to be pursued and acquired, and if these potentials are not kept in check, they can begin to erode the cognitive functioning of the soul in ways that make correct evaluation of actual benefit increasingly difficult to perform. (p. 108)

If, however, the appetites and the passions do not drive action, if they only "erode" or negatively influence our beliefs, then it seems that the position defended by B&S is after all a form of intellectualism. As the authors concede, it still excludes incontinence: "The role they [appetites and passions] play is, however, not one that would ever produce synchronic belief-akrasia" (p. 194), hence the avowal that "our own account continues to be an intellectualist picture" (p. 107).

Since intellectualism is so hard to avoid in the interpretation of the EPDs, one wonders why this allegedly implausible doctrine is so central to Socratic (or Platonic proleptic) thought. Before I turn to the background assumptions that entail the intellectualist explanation of wrong or unjust action, it is important to identify the locus of the false belief that renders the action involuntary. Consider the discussion with Polus the tyrant, who murders, robs and exiles his political opponents (Gorgias 466b-468e). When he orders an assassination he may have a false belief (a) about the morality of his action and/or (b) about its prudential benefit to himself. B&S seem to locate false beliefs in both (a) and (b): "Were the tyrant to understand both the wrongness of what he did, and also that wrongdoing actually damages the wrongdoer, he would desist from tyranny" (p. 93, my emphasis). I'm afraid this is inaccurate. To judge from the words of such advocates of tyrants as Callicles and Thrasymachus, the tyrant knows well that what he is doing is indeed unjust. Callicles grants that the pleonexia (grasping, greed) that motivates the misdeeds is unjust (in the socially accepted sense of "unjust") and he produces an alternative, "natural" concept of justice to glorify his hero (Gorgias 483b-484a). Thrasymachus baldly attributes to the tyrant "the most perfect injustice" (Rep. I 344a). It would be odd if the tyrant himself believed the opposite of this. It seems, therefore, that it is not a false belief about the morality of the action that plays an explanatory role. Understanding the wrongness of what he is doing does not lead the tyrant to desist. The false belief that Socratic intellectualism invokes to claim that the tyrant acted involuntarily must be exclusively a belief about his own good, as B&S initially granted (p. 1).

What are the background assumptions that lead to this paradoxical conviction? One of them is correctly identified by B&S: that we always and only desire what is really (not just apparently) good for us (pp. 47-48).

A further assumption is clearly needed to account for the falsehood of the belief that guides morally wrong action. It is this assumption, I submit, that is seriously misrepresented in B&S's book. They write: "It may at first seem that the Socratic view becomes more plausible once we remind ourselves that, as what we will be calling his 'prudentialism', Socrates did not distinguish ethical good and evil from prudential interest" (p. 44). This, I'm afraid, is seriously misleading. Consider Gorgias 474c4-d2 where Socrates asks first whether it is worse (kákion) to do wrong than to suffer wrong and then proceeds to ask whether it is more shameful (aíschion). A sharper distinction can hardly be drawn between the prudential and the moral perspective.

Indeed, Plato consistently uses the Greek equivalents of "unjust" (ádikon) or "shameful" (aischrón) and their opposites as moral predicates and restricts the equivalent of "good" (agathón) and of "bad" (kakón) to the prudential use. By often using "good" in a moral sense (for which there is no textual basis) our authors generate unnecessary confusion. For example, their Principle A1: "X is good = X is conducive to the securing of what is in the agent's interest" (p. 45) reads at first like a mere tautology until we realize from the lines above and below that "X is good" is meant to stand for "what we ought to do, ethically" or "what would be ethically required." On the other hand, in the book the term "evil" is sometimes used in the moral and sometimes in the prudential sense. This can even happen within one and the same sentence: "That which is conducive to vice and evil activity, Socrates regards as evil and harmful" (p. 115 and again further below on the same page). In my view, it is safer to always use "bad" for the clearly prudential kakón: Socrates regards as bad for the agent every unjust act, not "what is conducive to it."

In spite of the inadequate formulations, B&S are of course focusing on the central Socratic/Platonic tenet that morally upright action benefits the agent, that the just life is the good life. This claim is not a failure to distinguish two items. It is a substantive philosophical thesis put forward as a formerly agreed upon principle of ethics (Crito 48b), firmly restated in the conversation with Polus (Gorgias 470e), argued for in the refutation of Callicles (Gorgias 506c-508a), and, last but not least, defended extensively through Books II-X of the Republic.

The thesis that action in accordance with justice (or, more generally, with moral virtue) is the preponderant human good and that all other goods are completely derivative is the key to some of the Socratic convictions that at times become barely recognizable in B&S's treatment of them. In trying to explain how the tyrant harms himself the authors write:

To be sure, the tyrant who destroys an entire village in an act of vengeance knows that he will be hated for what he has done; that he must always watch his own back, his children will be in danger, and so forth. But he judges the good he gains for himself is worth the potential danger in which he puts himself and his loved ones (p. 93).

In other words, the loss of personal security of one's loved ones is taken to be bad and therefore security is taken to be the good that is endangered. I'm afraid I cannot find any textual basis for this. Consider the alternative explanation under the Socratic theory of the good: by committing an injustice the tyrant harms himself because he deprives himself of the central good of justice. There is no "potential danger" or "risk of damage". The harm to himself is in fact already done by his acting unjustly.

The key false belief, then, that explains wrongdoing, i.e., doing what's unjust, does not vary in different contexts, as suggested by such phrases as "under the circumstances" (cf. pp. 67, 99, 108). It is one and the same. It is the failure to grasp the good of justice or morally upright behavior. This assumption is sufficient to explain the key passages from the Apology, especially the one about the jurors harming themselves by the injustice of condemning to death an innocent man (p. 89). Strictly speaking no further explanation is required of "how and why Socrates thinks that wrongdoing damages the soul" (93).

However, B&S have a point when they press on and argue that appetites and passions play a role in affecting the failure of agents to grasp their real good:

So we are arguing that wrongdoing damages the soul by making the wrongdoer more and more susceptible to deceiving and incorrect assessments of what is in his own interest, assessments influenced by appetites and passions, which have their effects on the way in which we judge things representing their intended objects as benefits. The more the appetites and passions are satisfied and allowed to attain their goals, the more habituated we become to accepting their representations of goodness uncritically (p. 107).

I would say that this is probably a valid interpretation and extrapolation of the way Socrates reacts to Callicles' extolment of the passions (Gorgias 491e), but it is not clear to me that there is adequate evidence in the other EPDs that Socrates has much to say about this role of the passions. They are there, they are mentioned, but the direct connection of the passions with the false belief about the good of justice does not seem to be made. And even if it were made, morally wrong action would still be explained as an intellectual failure. I doubt many readers will be inclined to change their views on intellectualism in the EPDs after reading this learned work.

Among the valuable contributions to be found in this book, apart from the solid chapter on Plato, Aristotle and the Stoics, is its interpretation of the famous protreptic passage in the Euthydemus (278e-282e, pp. 168-172, 174-176). By translating eutychia as "good fortune" or "good luck" many scholars attribute to Socrates a perplexing or frankly absurd argument about human goods. B&S rightly observe that eutychia can mean "success" and that this rendering makes good sense in the context. Wisdom does not entail that one will be lucky, but rather that one has "the best chance to be successful at anything." (p. 168 n. 12).

I finally note two minor errors in quotations from the Greek. On p. 216 instead of orexeos one should print orexis or aneu orexeos. On p. 249 mala kala logos should be mala kalou logou.