Socratic Virtue: Making the Best of the Neither-Good-nor-Bad

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Naomi Reshotko, Socratic Virtue: Making the Best of the Neither-Good-nor-Bad, Cambridge University Press, 2006, 218pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521846188.

Reviewed by David Wolfsdorf, Temple University


Naomi Reshotko'sSocratic Virtueexamines the ethical theory espoused by the character Socrates in Plato's early dialogues. The book argues (9-14) that this ethical theory is attributable to the historical Socrates. (I suspect that no one who is skeptical of this conclusion will be convinced of the contrary on the basis of the evidence presented here.) In any event, Reshotko's overarching aim is to demystify Socrates' ethical theory by transcending the tendency "of contemporary readers to place an unwarranted overlay of post-Kantian morality back onto Plato's text." (6) She maintains that the early dialogues don't advance a moral and prescriptive theory, but merely a descriptive theory. "Human happiness is an objective goal. It can be approached using one's appreciation of what the world is like and how one can work within the constraints that nature places upon us … in order to change it." (14)

Beyond the introduction (1-18), the book divides into three parts: Socrates' theory of motivation (21-91), Socrates' theory of value (93-132), and Socrates' view of happiness and of the relation between virtue and happiness (133-192). The central argument of part one is that anachronistic assumptions about epistemology and desire hinder understanding of Socrates' conception of desire. Descartes' view that the content of our psychological states is incorrigible and Frege's view that the object of an intentional verb is the sense rather than the reference of the term have both left legacies that compel current belief that we know what we desire and whether we are happy. In contrast, Reshotko defends the interpretation that, for Socrates, everyone desires the actual good, genuine happiness, regardless of whether they know what that is. Reshotko speaks of this as the Dominance theory of desire.

Beyond the Dominance theory, Socrates is a psychological egoist; that is, he maintains that everyone aims to do what is in his or her self-interest. Furthermore, Socrates believes that all desire is rational; that is, everyone always does what they believe is the best means to the best end. Consequently, everyone always pursues their genuine happiness. The problem is that few understand how to achieve genuine happiness. Enter Socrates, who has a theory that explains the most promising means to achieve genuine happiness.

According to Socrates' theory of value, there are two sorts of good: virtue and happiness. Both are unconditional goods. But happiness is a "self-generated" good in that it "derives its value strictly from its inherent properties;" whereas virtue is an "other-generated" good in that it derives its value from happiness, precisely from its conduciveness to happiness. (96) Contrast virtue and happiness as unconditional goods with things that are neither-good-nor-bad, such as health or wealth, which, depending on the way in which they are used, may or may not be instrumental to happiness. For example, wealth, used viciously, conduces to misery.

The relation between virtue and happiness, in which Socrates is interested, is not one of definition or conceptuality. Thus, questions about the logical necessity or sufficiency of virtue for happiness -- common among Plato scholars of the last few decades -- are misguided. Rather, Socrates maintains that, given the way the world works, happiness can only be pursued through the pursuit of virtue. In other words, the relation between virtue and happiness is nomological and contingent. Consequently, although Socrates' theory is not prescriptive, given that everyone wants to become as happy as possible, the description of the theory "persuades those who understand it to endeavor to become as virtuous as possible." (14)

Demystification of Socratic ethics is completed in chapters eight and nine where Reshotko unveils the identities of virtue and happiness. In chapter eight, she argues that virtue is identical to knowledge, indeed, to the "scientific" knowledge of happiness or human advantage. This science "is simply the science of how to use that which is yielded by all the other sciences in order to produce happiness, by understanding that happiness is the goal of a human life, and what happiness is." (174) Finally, happiness itself is pleasure, more precisely modal, as opposed to sensate, pleasure. Modal pleasures are "things done in a certain way … effortlessly or without boredom, or are approached in a certain way, or have a particular value to a person. By contrast, sensate pleasures are the feelings that result from what is done." (180) As such, virtue may also be understood as "the science of measurement of present and future modal pleasures and pains." (18)

So much by way of an overview. Readers interested in slightly more amplification can find Reshotko's summary of her argument on pages 14-18.

I move now to criticism. To begin, let me clarify that I have strong views on the texts that Reshotko discusses. I have my own book and twenty articles on the subject. More often than not, I have reached different conclusions from Reshotko's.

Now, it should be emphasized that to the extent that Reshotko's contribution is original, its originality largely comes from its assemblage of parts, not from the parts themselves. Reshotko by no means conceals her debts, but the magnitude of those debts is rather striking. Reshotko was a student of Penner's at Madison; in the book she identifies him as her mentor. Part one of the book is essentially an elaboration of Penner's views. Reshotko says so herself: "It is Penner's theory of desire and intellectualism that I describe in the next three chapters." (4) Observe that beyond the introduction, the book is one hundred and seventy pages. Part one is seventy pages. Additionally, Reshotko's view of happiness as modal pleasure in chapter nine depends upon the work of Rudebusch (Socrates, Pleasure, and Value, OUP, 1999, especially chapters six through ten).

In one respect, it is refreshing to see a scholar earnestly and candidly building on the work of others, in contrast merely to criticizing. Moreover, Reshotko does not slavishly follow Penner or Rudebusch. She is an independent and creative thinker. She notes that Penner may not always agree with her; and her account of happiness and virtue's relation to it diverge from Rudebusch's in certain respects. My main concern, however, is that Penner's contributions, ingenious as they are, as well as Rudebusch's are textually indefensible. In short, the foundations of Reshotko's argument are unstable.

Penner's account of the Dominance theory of desire has been most forcefully expressed through his interpretation of Gorgias 466a-468e in "Power and desire in Socrates,"Apeiron 24 (1991) 147-202. In my "Rhetoric's Inadequate Means: Gorgias 466a4-468e5", Classical Philology, forthcoming, 2007, I argue, among other things, that Penner grossly misinterprets Socrates' claim that everyone desires the good in the Gorgias argument. In "The Desire for the Good: is the Meno inconsistent with the Gorgias?" Phronesis 39 (1994) 1-25, Penner, in collaboration with Rowe, attempts to extend his account of Socratic desire in Gorgias to Meno. Among other things, I criticize their interpretation of the Meno argument in "Desire for Good in Meno 77B2-78B6, "Classical Quarterly 56 (2006) 77-92. (See also Anagnostopoulos' article "Desire for the Good in the Meno," in Socrates and Plato: Desire, Identity, and Existence, Reshotko, ed., Academic Publishers, 2003, 171-91.)

Reshotko's treatment of Socratic intellectualism in chapter four depends upon Penner's account of Socrates' argument against akrasia in Protagoras in "Socrates on the strength of knowledge," Archiv für Geschichte der Philosophie 79 (1997) 117-49. Among other things, I criticize Penner's interpretation of Socrates' account of akrasia in Protagoras in "The Ridiculousness of Being Overcome by Pleasure: Protagoras 352b1-358d4, "Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 31 (2006) 113-36. Finally, my view of desire in Lysis, in Trials of Reason: Plato and the Crafting of Philosophy, OUP, forthcoming, 2007, chapter, diverges from that of Penner and Rowe in Plato's Lysis, CUP, 2005.

Rudebusch's book is essentially an attempt to reconcile the hedonism and anti-hedonism in Protagoras and Gorgias respectively. Rudebusch's solution is that in Protagoras Socrates is speaking of modal hedonism, whereas in Gorgias he is speaking of sensate hedonism. A number of recent discussions of Protagoras, mine included, maintain that in Protagoras Socrates is not endorsing any form of hedonism, but merely using hedonism to undermine Protagoras' position that courage and knowledge are not identical. Socrates' critique of akrasia does not in fact require ethical hedonism. (On this, see my OSAP article, cited above, which includes references to the numerous scholars who also maintain this view.)

Reshotko herself claims that Rudebusch's argument "begins by citing Republic I (349b-354as), where Socrates argues that true pleasure for a human being is virtuous activity (1999:126)." (180) In fact, nowhere in Republic I does Socrates argue that true pleasure for a human being is virtuous activity. Moreover, Rudebusch himself does not argue that in Republic I Socrates argues that true pleasure for a human being is virtuous activity. Rather, Rudebusch's argument for Socrates' commitment to the value of modal pleasure is based upon his interpretation (in chapter six) of Socrates' argument in Apology that death is something good. I have not published my own interpretation of this argument, nor have I published a criticism of Rudebusch's interpretation of the argument. Nevertheless, I believe (1) that the interpretation is not faithful to the text and (2) that even if it were faithful, this single argument could not carry the weight required to compel the conclusion that throughout the early dialogues Socrates or Plato endorses ethical modal hedonism.

In my view, the failure of Penner's Dominance theory interpretation of Socratic desire, regardless of the space Reshotko devotes to its articulation and elaboration, actually does little seriously to jeopardize the remainder of the book. However, the failure of Rudebusch's interpretation of Socratic ethical modal hedonism seriously threatens the vitality of Reshotko's contribution. If eudaimonia-- I will no longer speak of happiness -- is not modal pleasure, then Socrates' ethical theory remains rather mysterious. Moreover, the quasi-consequentialist framework that Reshotko attributes to Socrates comes undone. I emphasize that Reshotko is quite right to reject a Kantian interpretation of Socratic ethics, and I applaud her interest in naturalizing Socratic ethics; but, I repeat, her conclusions, which rest on the conclusions of others, are inadequately grounded in the primary evidence.

This serious defect of the work strikes me as unsurprising, given Reshotko's hermeneutic commitments. Neither Reshotko's, nor Penner's, nor even Rudebusch's (at least, see chapter seven) work merely attempts to offer a historically accurate interpretation of the content of Plato's early dialogues. Consider Reshotko's following words:

Learning philosophy from the works of Plato necessarily involves engaging in two interconnected tasks. We must try to figure out what Plato is trying to communicate to us, but we must also try to determine whether or not what is communicated is philosophically viable and even plausible. If we neglect this second task, or save it for 'later' (when we have completed the first), then we will not fulfill the requirements of the first. It is only when we are engaged with the text in a manner that insists on finding the most philosophically plausible interpretation of it that we are likely to interpret what Plato was saying correctly. (18)

In other words, Reshotko's book attempts to do two things more or less simultaneously: to interpret the content of Plato's dialogues and to defend the content as philosophically viable or at least plausible -- I would simply say "as true."

My own, primarily philological and historical approach to ancient philosophy, accordingly, tends toward a deep disagreement with Reshotko's. I do see a tension, exemplified in Reshotko's work -- and running back to her dissertation on Dretske and Socrates -- between interpreting ancient texts, on the one hand, and constructing a defensible ethical or psychological theory, on the other. "It is only when we are engaged with the text in a manner that insists on finding the most philosophically plausible interpretation of it that we are likely to interpret what Plato was saying correctly." This is a bold epistemological claim, and I reject it. Indeed, I take Reshotko's misinterpretation of Plato's early dialogues as symptomatic of the falsity of this claim.

I wonder whether there is a worry that if Socrates' theories are false, then the project of reading and interpreting Plato's early dialogues is a waste of time. But I say: let them be true or false; let this be the truth that we uncover; and let what is fascinating about the ideas and the form in which they are expressed, regardless of their truth value, stand revealed in their genuine historicity.