Solitary Confinement: Social Death and Its Afterlives

Placeholder book cover

Lisa Guenther, Solitary Confinement: Social Death and Its Afterlives, University of Minnesota Press, 2013, 321pp., $25.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780816679591.

Reviewed by Joy James, Williams College


Lisa Guenther's book is an important contribution to understanding the intricacies of prison torture, human rights violations within a democracy, and our shared vulnerabilities to the shattered consciousness of prisoners trapped in prolonged isolation. Guenther offers insights on how relationships or relationality constitute the human, suturing rational, cognitive, emotive structures. Prison solitary confinement, Guenther reveals, diminishes or destroys relationality; it is therefore both anti-human and anti-animal, and exists as an extreme expression of captivity that works against life. Given its promotion of social and mental disintegration, solitary confinement represents an inferno. And the climb out from hell is necessarily a philosophical one, according to Guenther.

This important work can be read as both a reflection on phenomenology and ethics and a liberation manifesto in struggles against captivity. The book provides genealogy, history and philosophical context for how democracy arrived at this present moment of de-humanization and de-animalization that reproduces totalitarianism in prison. Prison life in solitary confinement is a form of "social death." Whereas Orlando Patterson's original construction of social death -- the severance of natality, intentionality, connectivity under captivity -- in his 1982 Slavery and Social Death: A Comparative Study, from which Guenther draws her concept, is not dependent on black enslavement in the United States, Guenther's construction of social death through solitary confinement and torture is. ("Afro-pessimism" uses Patterson's concept of "social death" to posit an anti-black racism as structural antagonism extended to multiculturalism; Patterson likely does not accept this proposition; it is not clear where Guenther positions herself in this debate.) Solitary confinement as social death is about total control, an invasive reach into both the exterior and the interior spaces of the imprisoned.

The text develops its argument in three sections: "The Early U.S. Penitentiary System"; "The Modern Penitentiary"; and "Supermax Prisons." It reviews "living death" tied to early American notions of rehabilitation, solitude and penance; Husserl's critique of solitary confinement; the racialization of crime and blacks from enslavement; behavior modification; supermax prisons; ethics and responsibility. Guenther's inquiry links domestic carceral practices to foreign wars, physicians, government workers and agents, prison authorities and rebels; all agents in a maximum security world that retools war tactics for domestic populations. She provides devastating illustrations of the state disintegrating humans, including "de-animalizing" humans into segments of a whole, e.g., "acres of skin" (documented in Allen M. Hornblum's study of horrific medical experiments on prisoners: Acres of Skin: Human Experiments at Holmesburg Prison). Physical, emotional, psychological torture and dismemberment are recorded, analyzed and juxtaposed with phenomenological interventions to resist and reconstitute the human. Due to its engagement with philosophy, Solitary Confinement is more than a reflection on human rights:

It's not just that prisoners grow depressed or psychotic [in solitary confinement]; it's that the intersubjective basis for their concrete personhood . . . is structurally undermined by the prolonged deprivation of a concrete, everyday experience of other people." (35)

The philosophers mobilized are phenomenologists: Edmund Husserl, Maurice Merleau-Ponty, Emmanuel Levinas (Guenther has authored a book on Levinas) and, to a lesser degree, Frantz Fanon. Guenther uses Husserl to outline the personal ego, transcendental ego and complex monad as dependent on relations in the world. She deploys Merleau-Ponty to counter behaviorialist discourse and practices, and Levinas to posit an ethics of relationality. Levinas is the key architect here. Nazis killed his Lithuanian birth family; he toiled in a labor camp as a French prisoner of war while his wife and daughter hid in a French monastery. Levinas replaces metaphysical abstractions with an ethics of interrelatedness or relationships (denied him during war and lethal antisemitism). According to Guenther, personal ethical responsibility becomes the foundation for all knowledge including self-knowledge predicated on others against and with whom we forge identity.

Reformation of the prison bureaucracy's destructive solitary confinement expressed through "special housing units" and "lockdowns" is Guenther's charge. The book makes unique contributions to understanding of violations of the human and animal. Pragmatists and scientists speak the language of mental illness, suicidal and homicidal ideation. Guenther employs the philosophical language of the walking dead or uber-violent "monster" prisoner -- the no longer recognizably human due to state-induced prolonged isolation's absence of touch, sound, speech, nature, night following day. The ability to conjecture an "I" disappears in the absence of a "You"; thus solitary confinement shatters.

Guenther needs a philosophy that can also handle anti-black slavery and the anti-black racism disproportionately targeting black people for solitary confinement and the destruction of ethical relationships. The conceptual framework for and frailty of the chattel slave amid anti-black/African animus allows "slaves' powers and pleasures" to be used "to undermine and betray their own capacity for life beyond social death" (45).

The conventional strategies of reducing supermax prisons because of their costs and stigma in human and civil rights arenas (similar arguments apply to US mass incarceration and police brutality/homicides) are not centered here. The text condemns torture, sensory deprivation, strip searches and cavity searches (aka rape), forcible disassociation from family and kin, the banishment of intimacy and criminalization of political dissent and rebels through behavior modification and brutality; yet Guenther also requires us to move closer to the zones of violation in order to embrace both the violated and the implications of her thinking: "philosophy as an act of war."

Guenther works with a racially-fashioned democracy's prisons that allow solitary confinement to strip the prisoner of capacity to relate to others and the self's body and desires (for food, intimacy, touch, affection, love.) So the modern penitentiary operates as an expression of warfare. Guenther renders the "crime scene" as the prison and the point where abolitionism begins. How the "prison" might in fact have breeched its own walls and brought the crime scene to the doors of civil society is not clear. Race or anti-black racism is central in this project, but its role seems not clearly focused despite its usefulness in outlining the contours of de-humanizing confinement. Solitary Confinement traces torture and the destruction of the human to slavery, convict prison lease, Jim Crow segregation, containment of black political formations such as the Black Muslims and black panthers. Thus, social death is actually something beyond the penitentiary; which is the argument of Afro-pessimists largely marginalized in academia. These Afro-pessimists draw their inspirations from the very revolutionaries that Guenther quotes from: George Jackson and Assata Shakur, the most celebrated and vilified of black liberationists; and Frantz Fanon, psychiatrist and philosopher who served in the Algerian anti-colonial revolutionary war against the French. Fanon's quote from The Wretched of the Earth, that a government by and for the people must be a government by and for the disinherited, is made central in Guenther's definition of abolitionism. Jackson and Shakur, and Fanon, were literally fighting a state that was at war with them; their presence on battlefields was not through visitation. For them, rehabilitation and re-entry were not presented as viable options. Prison guards killed Jackson (and his seventeen-year old brother Jonathan). The FBI placed a two million dollar bounty on Shakur for a crime -- the shooting death of a white New Jersey State trooper -- that she maintains she did not commit. Guenther, interpreting Fanon, writes that abolition is not the rehabilitation of the captive or the tracking of the prisoner from slavery or plantation to prison but "collective resistance and revolution at the scene of 'crime' itself" (61); she is acknowledging the incendiary force of black liberation. For some this may seem to be its own form of inferno.

Guenther concludes by quoting the radical academic Angela Davis, imprisoned for her relationship with George and Jonathan Jackson. The multi-racial, international freedom campaign to free Davis (then a member of the Communist Party USA and an icon in cold war politics) and her exoneration in U.S. court paved re-entry into academia and accepted forms of activism from which most cannot benefit. Guenther's suggestion that we chant as Davis did during her incarceration to free all of the women imprisoned with her calls for the interconnectedness of the "we are you", but it is decontextualized from the FBI Cointelpro lethal interventions into black freedom movements. Still, Guenther asks an important question: "Who might we become together if we join in solidarity to create new afterlives in resistance to social death?" "Who might we become?" is also dependent upon how we see social death manifest outside of prison walls and see solitary in the isolated vulnerability to trauma and terror, rape and dismemberment in captivity, and recently recognized disvalued citizenry's encounters with police.

The question of "who we might become" is reflected in Baltimore following the death of Freddie Gray and Pennsylvania prison systems that house Mumia Abu-Jamal. Abu-Jamal faces death from diabetes and medical neglect. He does not appear in Solitary Confinement, yet Abu-Jamal spent 30 years on death row (and then was transferred), convicted of the 1981 shooting death of a white police officer, a crime he maintains he did not commit. Novelist John Edgar Wideman notes in his introduction to Abu-Jamal's 1996 Live from Death Row that if freed from prison Abu-Jamal would consider himself still a captive. The journalist, a former black panther and MOVE member, is the center of campaigns for his release and freedom from medical neglect: prison authorities' isolating him from his private doctor, wife, son, friends, attorney, advocates; an alleged diet of let "'em eat cake/pasta" prison food, a dismissive transforming prison beds into death beds; Pennsylvania's unconstitutional "Revictimization Relief Act" (the "Muzzle Mumia Law"), which sought to silence not only the political prisoner's college lectures and commencement addresses, but also communication from all Pennsylvania prisoners to the outside. The "we are you" of third graders in Orange County, New Jersey, who voluntarily sent "get well cards" to Abu-Jamal, resulted in their teacher Marilyn Zuniga being suspended (during a Black History month lesson she had introduced the class to Abu-Jamal's quote: "So long as one just person is silenced, there is no justice"); and Philadelphia Fraternal Order of Police President John McNesby telling media that Zuniga teaches students "how to interact with a convicted cop killer." This is the domination of bureaucracies, prison, police unions, politicians, and the fear of violence from the "rabble" frays, the "we are you" equation.

Philosophy as an "act of war" has issued a battle cry whose combat strategy needs to address the afterlives of anti-black racism that feed prison solitary confinement. Guenther notes that the "social death of prisoners sticks to the social life" of those never incarcerated; yet those never incarcerated flee rhetorically and physically from the prisoner-in-waiting resisting solitary confinement in a Baltimore padded police wagon, decay from diabetes in a Pennsylvania prison cell, asphyxiation from chokehold under NYPD bodies. Social death appends to black people who are not formal prisoners. Law abiding politicians and police and citizenry obscure how social death appends to all blacks with language of worthy "legitimate protestors" and unworthy "thugs" petitioning for social life. Guenther's philosophical imperative to build a social movement to resist social death resonates in the April 2015 message sent by President Barack Obama, a law and order proponent, during riots following the police homicide of Freddie Gray in Baltimore: we need a "movement" to save our young from violence and poverty. Yet, unlike Guenther, the President does not acknowledge that police (like prison guards) riot with devastating and near impunity. He does admit that he cannot control police (or guard) aggression, which presents a challenging dilemma not fully explored by Guenther because democracy is not suppose to be a state of war. A civil society where implicit and explicit bias obstructs views of black people as inherently, fully human, misses cues to collective grief in riots of rage and opportunism. If it cannot register the theft of social life from blacks as a prerequisite for social life and honor for nonblacks, then it fails to see how catching hell is a structural and collective, not just personal and individual, phenomenon. Thus, the potential for relationality is diminished if not extinguished.

In Dante's Inferno, the seventh circle captures the offender against people and property, the rapist, murderer, thief. Even more distant from freedom is the ninth circle, that of treachery, pride and betrayal of care and relationality from those empowered to protect familial/filial relations with God and others. This is the supermax lockdown for Cain, Judas, and Satan, all immobilized in frozen reservoirs, never to return into community. If bureaucracies by which we are governed and by which we govern ourselves lack consciousness and capacity to grieve and repair damages inflicted onto humanity, then our climb out of their inferno into relationality suggests a transformational trek. Lisa Guenther's Solitary Confinement provides one guidebook for such a difficult journey.