Songs of Experience: Modern American and European Variations on a Universal Theme

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Martin Jay, Songs of Experience: Modern American and European Variations on a Universal Theme, University of California Press, 2005, 431pp., $21.95 (pbk), ISBN 0520248236.

Reviewed by J.M. Bernstein, New School for Social Research


Wilhelm Dilthey's lament that "there is no real blood flowing in the veins of the knowing subject fabricated by Locke, Hume, and Kant, but only the diluted lymph of reason as mere intellectual activity" (43) finds in the desiccations of modern epistemology both a symptom and cause of modernity's destruction of experience. On the one hand, epistemology engenders the dehydration of experience by regimenting and methodically structuring experience in order that it be in harmony with the deliverances of modern physics; on the other hand, physics' quantitative, deterministic construction of nature is construed as a component in wider processes of disenchantment in which the deracination of the individual from her place in nature and society severs the vital connection between living experience and world. Each calibrated refinement of experience (from Bacon to Quine), and each anxious attempt to locate a moment of compelling experience that would be a counter to its historic demise (from Burke to Bataille), can be interpreted as revealing a contour or torsion in the meaning of modernity. Experience is one of those concepts whose philosophical construction and deconstruction, erasure and expansion, emptying and filling have become a site for registering philosophy's comprehension and investment in the modern world.

Martin Jay's virtuoso mapping of this site follows the method of the history of ideas rather than philosophical contestation -- hence the appropriateness of his borrowing from William Blake for his title. Rather than attempting to offer another account of what experience really or authentically is, with great hermeneutical sensitivity and critical verve, Jay delicately untangles the meaning and stakes experience had for his diverse authors, unearthing the urgencies they felt in doing the normally dry office of explicating a concept:

Theirs have been … as much 'songs' of passion as sober analyses. At some times, these songs have been lyrical panegyrics, at others, elegiac laments, at still others, bitter denunciations, but they have almost always been deeply felt. 'Experience,' it turns out, is a signifier that unleashes remarkable emotion in many who put special emphasis on it in their thought. (1)

Jay begins his story with what almost feels like a mythical original scene of experience flourishing followed by the hour of its methodological repression. The scene of flourishing is the account in Montaigne's great essay "Experience," where the initial contrast between knowledge and experience allows Montaigne to affirm openness, inconclusiveness, diversity, history, finitude (the joys or sorrows of the moment as opposed to the promises of eternity), and even mortality -- the one event that cannot be experienced. Experience, which is never defined by Montaigne, becomes a code word for what cannot be codified, deduced, made certain, for what belongs to the scope of an individual life together with its experiential inheritances and bequeaths.

The melodramatic counterpoint to the fullness of experience in Montaigne is provided by Francis Bacon's methodological regimentation of it in which: (i) "the uniqueness of 'inner experience' was replaced by the intersubjectively confirmable data of controlled experiment" (34); (ii) a distinction was drawn between the personal, psychological subject and the transcendental subject whose lifespan went beyond that of the individual human being; (iii) in contrast to Montaigne's humanism in which the memory of past successes and failures remains a part of experience, scientific knowing deliberately obliterates memory as relevant to the content and evaluation of theory; and (iv) "the bodily learning based on the senses that Montaigne had championed as the fallible yet necessary ground of experience was … increasingly replaced by 'objective' instruments whose registering of stimuli from the external world were purportedly more accurate and disinterested" (36). Jay is fond of Bruno Latour's phrasing of the last element: "the testimony of nonhumans."

After a pointed rehearsal of the epistemological formation of experience in empiricism and Kant (Chapter 2), Jay first tracks the diverse attempts to redeem experience by uplifting one of its distinctive modes: religious experience in Schleiermacher, James, Otto, and Buber -- all in response to Kant's privileging of procedural morality over religion (Chapter 3); aesthetic experience from Kant to Dewey (Chapter 4); political experience in Burke, Oakeshott, and the intriguing debate in British Marxism that stemmed from the proposed recovery of experience in the writings of Raymond Williams and E.P. Thompson -- a debate that reveals how the discourse of experience is not a prerogative of the right (Chapter 5); and historical experience in Dilthey, Collingwood, and, Franklin Ankersmit's response to the poststructuralist, linguistic-turn critique of the very idea of a privileged historical experience as represented by Joan W. Scott (Chapter 6).

The advantage of concentrating on modes of experience is that it permits a fine-grained differentiation of aspects of experience, both subjectively (e.g., the feeling of piety by the believer) and objectively (the experience of something wholly other), so, at least, giving precision to what gets excised by epistemological narrowing and lost in the reifications attendant on the technological and bureaucratic transformations of modern life. In the final three chapters, Jay tracks philosophers who, however differently, have wanted to reverse the process of differentiation and reclaim for themselves some irreducible notion of authentic experience (Montaigne regained, as it were): James' and Dewey's pragmatism, followed by Rorty's repudiation of experience-talk in favor of language-talk (Chapter 7); the critical theories of Benjamin and Adorno with their pointed lamentations over the loss of experience (Chapter 8); and, surprisingly perhaps, the reconstitution of experience without a subject in the poststructuralism of Bataille, Barthes, and Foucault (Chapter 9).

To have covered such an immense intellectual territory with the accuracy, empathy, patience, and breathtaking scholarship that Jay manages is a small miracle of humane studies. And yet, it would be almost impossible not to be disappointed by this book. The disappointment might be thought to be the inevitable upshot of the contrast between concept and object, between theories of experience and experience itself. Yet the satisfactions of aesthetics, say, need not make one feel one should have been experiencing artworks instead. I think the difficulty lies elsewhere. Whether each chapter is taken as a song cycle or as a distinct location on the map of experience, there is something troublingly paradoxical about Jay's project: what are we to make of a map in which no discrimination is made between real and imagined places? Or where the rules of projection work to suppress the distinction between near and far, plausible and implausible? This cartographic paradox is the natural upshot of Jay's decision to employ the historian's method of distanced neutrality -- he speaks of it as resisting "the temptation to bestow the normative aura of 'real' … experience on any of the contenders" (401) -- as a mechanism of inclusiveness. This wide embrace, even when amended to include sensible criticisms, works against the marshalling of strongly-argued distinctions. Hence, when in his conclusion Jay himself worries that his neutrality may have left the field as incoherent as he found it, my complaint is not that he is unjustified in drawing the few inductive generalizations he does; it is that those sensible views appear less compelling than they would have if they had been argued for directly.

Jay could respond to this by arguing that disappointment is constitutive of the trade-off involved in shifting from the critical evaluation of ideas to the history of ideas: this kind of history's grey-on-grey is necessarily mournful. But disappointment, at least as I am responding to this book, is not grief; indeed, my complaint might be that it is just the absence of loss and grief that is the problem. In a shimmering moment in the discussion of Emerson's "Experience," Jay pointedly quotes a passage from Sharon Cameron's essay "Representing Grief: Emerson's 'Experience'," (Representations 15, Summer 1986) in which she argues that Emerson not only grieves for his son, but also for his inability to feel that grief as he imagines it should be felt, that is, as fully and utterly unbearable; hence

grief becomes a trope for experience because the self's relation to experience, like its relation to grief, is oblique, angled, contingent, dissociated… . Once the self understands its relation to experience, what it understands is something has been removed. Death is the source of that understanding, teaching us our relation to every other event.

In this respect, my disappointment in this book is grounded in what is, arguably, a constitutive aspect of experience: by not risking the discriminations that would honor some versions of experience as authentic and others not, Jay excises the possibility of loss and so of experience from his narrative. If concepts are bearers of experience, if experience is central to the life of the concept, then even the history of a concept must have an experiential dimension, that is, a suitably charged exposition of irredeemable loss. (I always assume that this is the orienting history lesson of Hegel's Phenomenology of Spirit, what it means to leave immediacy behind, which nearly every reading of the text anxiously reverses into its opposite. But that is an argument for another occasion.)

Of course, no one knows better than Jay the bond connecting history and experience; it is what gives his chapter on that topic its particular pathos. After weaving his way through the familiar territory of Oakeshott, Dilthey, and Collingwood, Jay turns to Joan W. Scott's critique of the school of experience, in particular the experiential turn in feminist "history from below." Her fundamental thesis is that there is no tidy lived past reality that might be re-experienced or re-enacted in the present; rather experience is "always a constructed category that contains within it the ideological residues of the discursive context out of which it emerged" (250). As he summarizes the skeptical argument, Jay makes clear that it threatens the very possibility of there being a role for experience within historical inquiry:

Whether history is a 'world of ideas' produced by the historian, as Oakeshott claimed, or the reconstruction of 'discursive events' that Scott saw as 'necessarily tied to the historian's recognition of his or her stake in the production of knowledge,' foundational primacy could never be given to past Erlebnis in itself. (255)

Evidently, more than foundational primacy is at stake in this statement.

Now it is Jay's urge not to let matters rest here that pushes him to turn to the only key player in his text whom I had not previously come across, the Dutch philosopher of history Franklin R. Ankersmit. In broad terms, Ankersmit's strategy is to devise a postmodern notion of experience that draws on the aesthetics of the sublime, that is, on the idea of an experiential moment that erupts and disrupts the smooth, controlled movement of linguistic expectation and appropriation. The issue, familiar to readers of Gadamer, is how to, as best as possible, ensure that the past is not reduced to being a dull mirror image of the present. Jay returns to Ankersmit in seeking to rebut Rorty's lingualism in which the language of the present necessarily trumps all competitors. So for Ankersmit,

the present historian has to resist assimilating the past too radically to contemporary concerns and idioms, which Rorty, with his stress on language all the way down, cannot avoid doing. He or she should register instead the strangeness of the residues of a past that is 'other' to the present. (307)

One might have supposed that it would be just here that Jay might have been tempted to insert his own enterprise; but it is not.

As the discussion of Rorty concludes, Jay notes that the premise of his book is that "there are discourses of experience that inflect the way in which the term has functioned in different contexts, even if there are enough family resemblances among them to permit a more general account" (309). What this passage begins to make evident, is that it is the skeptical voices that, malgré lui, have most impressed themselves on Jay. He knows that the unsurpassable issue here is the status of his "inflect", whether it means "to constitute out of whole cloth" (the 'language all the way down' view) or not (language is dependent on its other with which it never gets on level terms). What is surprising is that with the stakes so high, Jay turns first to Agamben's account of infancy (a world of experience before language), and then in his final chapter to the idea of limit experiences in Bataille, Barthes, and Foucault in way of response. What this does is tacitly set up an opposition between concept and experience, thus severing experience from the life of the concept. And while sublime, infant, limit experiences may be useful for illustrative purposes, mustn't the true stakes concern experience in the concept, in language, not outside (before or after the concept)?

That it is to the exorbitant discourse of limit experiences to which Jay feels compelled to turn in order to salvage something of the very idea of experience speaks to the extent to which this book was written under the shadow of the skeptical denial of experience. If, again, experience always involves the loss of experience, if experience bears within its very heights absence, loss, and grief (and the shudder of dislocation in learning grief is bearable, livable), if experience is the medium through which we discover the expanse of suffering, then the reason why Jay's work should feel disappointing rather than grieving is that it begins beyond experience, beyond the loss which its every word records.