Sophie de Grouchy's Letters on Sympathy: A Critical Engagement with Adam Smith's The Theory of Moral Sentiments

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Sophie de Grouchy, Sophie de Grouchy's Letters on Sympathy: A Critical Engagement with Adam Smith's The Theory of Moral Sentiments, Sandrine Bergès (tr., comm.), Eric Schliesser (comm.), Oxford University Press, 2019, 181pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780190637095.

Reviewed by Olivia Bailey, Tulane University


Sophie de Grouchy, Marquise de Condorcet (1764-1822) was a philosopher and salonnière of the French Revolution, a character striking for her verve and courage as well as her erudition. Her life was marked by tremendous hardship. As an associate of the Girondins, she endured grave losses during the time of the Terror: her property was seized, she remained under constant threat of arrest, and her husband, the philosopher and mathematician Nicolas Condorcet, died in prison. Grouchy survived through her remarkable resourcefulness. To save herself from poverty, she composed a translation of Adam Smith's The Theory of Moral Sentiments (TMS) so good that it remained the definitive French translation for two hundred years. As an appendix to her translation, she also published her Lettres sur la sympathie, which together comprise a piece of moral psychology and political philosophy that deserves far more attention than it has yet received.

Over the course of eight epistolary essays, presented here in a new English translation by Sandrine Bergès, Grouchy builds an ambitious account of the nature and significance of sympathy that surpasses Smith's work in several important respects. For one thing, the Letters aim at a more complete account of the origins of sympathy, one that traces the phenomenon back to its most basic physiological origins. For another, the Letters advance more deeply than TMS into questions about how particular political and economic structures interact with this disposition of the human mind, inhibiting or reinforcing the development of sympathy and its attendant virtues. While Smith gestures at the ways that courtly norms tend to foster foolishness and corruption, Grouchy gives us both a more detailed analysis of how institutional arrangements underpin vice and actual recommendations for the construction of a more sympathetic society. Among other things, she calls for specific amendments to the criminal law, recommends a redistribution of the tax burden, and argues for the institutions of divorce and temporary marriage.

This is exciting stuff. Why, then, is Grouchy's work so little known? Why did it have to wait until the 21st century to even get its first English translation, and why has Grouchy largely been left out of the history of woman philosophers? Part of the story may have to do with the framing of the Letters as a commentary on TMS. Grouchy herself is quite frank about her work's originality. She does not "follow the ideas of this Edinburgh philosopher," she is "caught up in her own" (58). Nevertheless, Karin Brown, author of the introduction to the first English language translation of the Letters, seems to reflect the consensus view when she emphasizes that the letters "do not stand on their own" (Letters on Sympathy: A Critical Edition, James McClellan III (tr.), Transactions of the American Philosophical Society, 2008). Part of Grouchy's obscurity may also have to do with the fact that the Letters do not form part of a larger body of work, or at least not one whose boundaries are at all clear (Bergès has recently made a compelling case for the attribution of two additional anonymous essays to Grouchy). But whatever the cause of this historic neglect, the tide is now starting to shift. A renaissance of interest in sympathy, empathy, and related phenomena, combined with the will to recover heretofore marginalized philosophical voices, makes this a particularly good moment for Grouchy. In recent years, a small literature has started to take shape around Grouchy's work, split between French and English, and between philosophy, political economy, and intellectual history. This new English translation, with a commentary by Bergès and Eric Schliesser, who have already contributed most significantly to that literature, represents a major step in elevating Grouchy's status as a philosophical figure.

This edition of the Letters is part of the Oxford New Histories in Philosophy, which has the dual remit of providing resources useful for researchers whilst also making previously obscure texts accessible to students. Bergès and Schliesser clearly aim to respond to both of these goals with the choices they have made about both the translation itself and its accompanying supplementary material. This material includes a lengthy introduction, a glossary, and an annotated bibliography. The text is also enhanced with footnotes that track probable lines of influence, indicate points of contrast with Smith and other philosophers, and highlight points of connection between different parts of the Letters.

The introduction opens with a concise biography that gives a sense of Grouchy's intellectual formation and of her status as a revolutionary figure. A discussion of her sources follows, with particular attention devoted to Fénelon and Vauvenargues. Readers anxious to hear about Grouchy's own views may be tempted to pass over the discussion of these relatively little-known figures, but that would be a mistake, since it is actually here that Bergès and Schliesser fold in their helpful analyses of Grouchy's conceptions of utility and moral evil. This is rounded off with a discussion of other woman philosophers of the revolutionary period. Interestingly, while Bergès and Schliesser note here that "there are hints of Grouchy's feminism in the Letters on Sympathy," they do not choose to feature the feminist dimensions of the work as one of the "Selected Themes" with which they conclude. That is very different from Brown's approach in her introduction to the 2008 McClellan translation, which devotes thirty pages to Grouchy and feminist ethics. Of course, an introduction can take on only so many topics. Still, the Letters do seem like a text instructors might want to feature in courses on feminist philosophy, and one wonders whether it wouldn't have been both possible and desirable to include a more robust introductory discussion of those "hints" of feminism, without falling into unwieldiness or (worse) anachronism.

In a section of the introduction that compares the Letters and TMS, Bergès and Schliesser seek to explain exactly how Grouchy departs from Smith. Grouchy's most central criticism of Smith is that when it comes to the phenomenon of sympathy, Smith did not "discover its first cause and show, at least, why sympathy is the property of every sensible being susceptible to reflection" (58). She wants to offer us an account of how it is that we come to acquire sympathy in the first place. Since Grouchy places this ambition front and center as the main task of her first letter, Bergès and Schliesser are quite right to spend some time on the details of her origin story for sympathy. That story, they suggest, crucially involves the conversion of sensibility into sympathy.

Bergès and Schliesser's reconstruction of the conversion is not entirely crystalline. Sensibility, the "preexisting condition" from which sympathy is to emerge, is first defined like so: "sensibility is the disposition to feel someone else's pain and pleasure" (30). Two lines later, though, Bergès and Schliesser write that "sensibility, or the capacity to feel pain or pleasure, is to be understood as the basis for sympathy. Someone who does not recognize pain or pleasure in himself is not likely to sense it in others" (30). These different formulations invite a host of questions: is sensibility a capacity or a disposition? Is sensibility, as the latter lines suggest, a matter of being able to feel my own pain and pleasure, or (as the former lines suggest) others' pain and pleasure? Or does it encompass both? In which case: is sensibility just the genus of which sympathy is a species? That might jibe well with Grouchy's own characterization of sympathy as "the disposition we have to feel in a way similar to others," but Bergès and Schliesser claim that for Grouchy sympathy is "unlike" sensibility: sensibility is a preexisting condition, but sympathy is a "complex emotion" that emerges only through education. The glossary does not really clear the matter up: there, "sensitivity/sensibility" is defined as "a property of matter that facilitates our capacity to experience the world through the senses" (158).

These terminological difficulties should not prevent us from grasping the basic mechanisms that are responsible for sympathy on Grouchy's account. In a nutshell: Grouchy begins with the experience of physical suffering, and argues that that experience involves two distinctive sensations of pain. There is a local sensation of pain in the affected body part, and also a very distressing additional sensation of pain that is non-local. This second sensation of pain, unlike the first, is easily "renewed" when we recall previous pains (62). It also liable to be felt when we see or recognize that another is in pain, starting with our earliest recognition of the feelings of our caretakers. The feeling of generalized pain prompted by the observation or knowledge of another's pain is the feeling to which we are disposed insofar as we are sympathetic. However, we acquire the actual disposition of sympathy only via reflection. Through reflection, an operation which fixes our views on others' suffering, we develop a more durable sympathetic pain response, we extend this response to include moral (psychological) pains, and we expand its reach beyond the pains of those who are physically and psychologically close to us, to the pains of those who are remote or even unknown. Finally, reflection is said to have a motivational impact. It makes others' suffering interesting to us and forces us into action.

Bergès and Schliesser suggest that that one plausible way to think about Grouchy's origin story for sympathy is not so much as departing from Smith, but rather as progressing his account. It is worth dwelling for a moment on that suggestion. Should we take Grouchy to be filling in bits of Smith's account that Smith himself, manifestly no expert in child development, simply failed to include? Or is Grouchy up to something rather more radical? Grouchy's conception of what mature sympathy involves seems to be quite different from Smith's, to the point where we might wonder whether they really have the same phenomenon in view. And, what is more, her core ideas about what sympathy actually does for us as moral and social beings also seem to depart from Smith's in important ways.

According to Smith, sympathy involves feeling the way another feels because and insofar as we inhabit the other's situation through a feat of imagination, and emotionally respond to those imagined circumstances in a way that matches or at least harmonizes with the other's feelings. Two points of difference with Grouchy are already evident. First, for Smith, it is not (or not principally) the sight or knowledge of the other's emotion, but rather the contemplation of their circumstances, that typically elicits the sympathetic reaction. And, second, Smith underscores that the imaginative shift required for sympathy is typically active and effortful. We are motivated do the work of entering into another's position, and of finding our way to a match with the other's feelings, because it is pleasing to be in affective agreement with others. Why is it pleasing to be in affective agreement with others? Well, here there admittedly is a gap in Smith's account. The origins of this pleasure are never explained. But presumably a precondition for taking pleasure in affective agreement with others is being interested in or concerned with other feelings. If I were not already concerned with other people and their emotional lives, then presumably I would have no reason to put in the effort to sympathize with them.

Grouchy's account seems to reverse the order of explanation. It is not that we have an interest in other people and their feelings that partially or fully explains our tendency to sympathize, but rather that our tendency to sympathize can explain our interest in other people and their feelings. She claims that sympathy is the "first cause" of benevolent and humane motivation. But how exactly does sympathy cause humane motivation? It is easy to understand why my sympathetic pain, occasioned by the thought or sight of another's pain, gives me a reason to do something to stop my own pain, and stopping the other's pain is obviously one way of putting an end to my sympathetic pain. But it is not as obvious how or whether Grouchy can explain the origin of what we might have thought was key to distinctively benevolent action, namely a motivation to help others for their own sake. Is sympathy really the sort of thing that can generate a concern for others that is independent of their status as bearers of pains and pleasures, pains and pleasures that in turn impact our own well-being? Or must sympathetically-derived motivation remain covertly egoistic? That problem is not Grouchy's alone. In fact, it is also highly relevant for those philosophers and psychologists who have in our own time sought to source the roots of altruism in sympathetic or empathetic pain. But I think it is worth investigating how Grouchy in particular can address this worry, especially because the concrete political recommendations she makes in the later letters all build upon the thought that sympathy is the key to having the right sort of moral orientation toward others. Perhaps a closer examination of her mechanism of reflection will resolve this concern, but Grouchy is less clear about the exact workings of reflection than we might wish her to be.

Grouchy's theory is not without its difficulties. But it is also worth stressing that her exploration of sympathy's significance includes much that is interesting and promising even if one is not fully persuaded by the way she grounds benevolence in sympathy. Bergès and Schliesser nicely finish off their introduction by highlighting some of the most intriguing and novel features of her discussion. They lucidly explain, for instance, how Grouchy's republican commitment to non-domination interacts with her claims about sympathy. Domination is cast as the natural enemy of sympathy, since it sets up a distance between the powerful and the powerless that is inimical to fellow-feeling. Bergès and Schliesser also include a fascinating and helpful review of Grouchy's aesthetics, including her account of how our tendency to sympathize with charismatic or beautiful speakers causes us to fall under the spell of bad actors. Domination and demagoguery have never felt like more timely topics, and Bergès and Schliesser's succinct but well-considered analysis shows that Grouchy's work is a fertile source for philosophers interested in questions about the affective underpinnings of liberty and of social epistemic vice.

It remains to say a word about the quality of Bergès' translation. Grouchy worries about the distorting political power of rhetoric, but she also clearly delights in exercising her own rhetorical skill. She makes effective use of anaphora and apostrophe, of colorful illustrations and long, complex sentences that gather emotional steam as they run along. Bergès does an exceptionally good job of preserving all these elements of Grouchy's style. Whereas McClellan's 2008 translation smooths over much of the Letters' grammatical complexity, Bergès does more to preserve Grouchy's sometimes baroque reflexive constructions, and often resists chopping up her longer sentences. These choices maintain the text's charm and make it feel more of its time. They also may make Bergès' translation a touch less accessible for students, but that small downside is more than compensated for by the additional resources that accompany the text, especially the informational footnotes. In addition to highlighting connections to other philosophers of the Enlightenment and Revolution, some of these notes also indicate links to recent debates over topics like standpoint epistemology and the philosophy of horror cinema. I can easily imagine these latter notes piquing student interest and prompting lively discussion.