Sophistry and Political Philosophy: Protagoras' Challenge to Socrates

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Robert C. Bartlett, Sophistry and Political Philosophy: Protagoras' Challenge to Socrates, University of Chicago Press, 2016, 248pp., $40.00, ISBN 9780226394282.

Reviewed by Giovanni Giorgini, University of Bologna/Princeton University


Robert C. Bartlett offers a refined interpretation of two Platonic dialogues -the Protagoras and the Theaetetus- as well as a subtle attack at contemporary post-modern, relativistic philosophies. Bartlett correctly identifies in the sophist Protagoras one of the most challenging thinkers for Plato's moral and political project. Also, if someone wishes to attack post-modernism and its intrinsic relativism from its foundation, the choice of Protagoras, the first consistent relativist, is perfect; and the task is made more interesting by the fact that most of the information we have about his thought comes from his intellectual nemesis -Plato. The fact the Plato tackled Protagoras' thought in many of his dialogues, up to his final work, the Laws, testifies to the stature of the sophist from Abdera and to the respect Plato had for his thought.

The key to understanding Bartlett's work is in the opening sentence, where the author maintains that "political philosophy appears to have been supplanted in our time by the study of the history of political philosophy, on the one hand, and by self-described sophistry, on the other" (p. 1). From what follows we gather that the contemporary 'sophists' Bartlett is targeting are Nietzsche's heirs, namely authors such as Foucault and Derrida, Rorty and Fish; conversely, he interprets political philosophy in the 'classical', Platonic way as "the attempt to grasp the (eternal) truths of moral-political life or its permanent questions" (p. 3). It is evident from this premise that this is a much more ambitious work than the author's restrained characterization would suggest -- "an exercise in the history of political philosophy" (p. 2), and that underneath the interpretative effort there lies a philosophical-political agenda which surfaces only occasionally. Briefly, this is a work which will appeal to classicists and ancient philosophers, who will find an insightful analysis of Platonic ideas; and to political theorists, who will enjoy Bartlett's thought-provoking suggestions.

The author's precise style and attention to details requires close attention. This is again evident from the opening line, where Bartlett tells us that political philosophy "appears to have been supplanted" (emphasis mine) by two other intellectual vogues, while it is evident that he does not believe this to be the case: in fact, his book is a demonstration that political philosophy, in its classical meaning, is still alive. Moreover, his historical analysis will show the superiority of the Socratic/Platonic stance as contrasted to materialism and relativism, thus paving the way to a full revival of (classical) political philosophy. Protagoras is the philosophical 'founding father' of relativism and Bartlett's examination of the challenge he posed to Socrates and Plato is meritorious. In doing so, he focuses on the two dialogues in which Protagoras plays a major role, occasionally importing ideas from other dialogues in a way that shows his deep familiarity with Plato's works.

The first part of the book is devoted to an examination of the Protagoras, one of the most refined Platonic dialogues from the point of view of the dramatic setting. It is a reported dialogue: the date of the action is 433-32 BCE, before the Peloponnesian war, a time when Athens was at the peak of its power and Socrates in the prime of his life. Bartlett rightly notices the connection between the opening scene of the dialogue -a rich, young friend of Socrates wants to become a pupil of the great sophist Protagoras- and the accusation levelled at Socrates of corrupting the young. One of the most famous parts of this dialogue is the 'Great Speech' Protagoras delivers to show that virtue is teachable and that all human beings are endowed with the two virtues which compose "political art", namely respect and justice. Bartlett finds in Protagoras' speech the view that the gods are a human creation (pp. 33-8) and that there is neither intelligent design in the universe nor divine guidance for the human race. I find these statements puzzling, since Protagoras clearly states that Prometheus (a Titan) stole the fire from the gods to help mankind survive (Prot. 321d) and Zeus sent his messenger Hermes to bring political art to human beings for fear that the human race would be completely annihilated (322b-d).

Bartlett seems to read the Great Speech in light of Protagoras' fragment on the gods (DK80 B4), where he professes his agnosticism. Admittedly, reconciling the two views is complicated but Bartlett's solution (reading in the Great Speech the opposite of what it openly says) seems to me unconvincing. Protagoras asks his listeners whether they prefer a myth or a rational argument (logos) and then opts for a myth, probably to please the vast and varied audience congregating in Callias' house (Prot. 320c); it is reasonable that a myth may contain elements of fancy such as the traditional idea of gods' care for human beings. The same idea will recur in Plato's own myth in the Politicus, which is a clear reply to Protagoras' Great Speech, since it deals with the original condition of mankind. In addition, attributing to god's intervention men's possession of political art is a very strong argument in favour of democracy.

Another famous part of the dialogue concerns Socrates' idea of the existence of an "art of measurement" (Prot. 356d), which dissolves the power of appearances and enables people to weigh pleasures and pains and therefore live a most blessed life. Bartlett maintains that Protagoras is here depicted as a hedonist for he believes that happiness consists in maximizing pleasure; his discussion with Socrates about courage, however, reveals that he "retains an admiration for the nobility of courage" (p. 98) that cannot be reduced to a calculation of what is most pleasurable in a specific circumstance. Bartlett concludes that the long discussion of courage shows Protagoras to be confused. Protagoras is here certainly refuted, as he himself reluctantly admits, but his refutation leads to a disconcerting end: the two positions have reversed, for now Socrates maintains that virtue is teachable and Protagoras seems to deny that. Socrates' victory comes at the price of accepting his adversary's original position. The polite end, with the two main interlocutors exchanging compliments, seems to indicate that Plato's point was to show how the search for truth should be conducted: among people who are genuinely interested in the truth and are not afraid to pursue the search to its logical conclusion.

The second part of the book is devoted to the Theaetetus which, Bartlett reminds us, belongs to a trilogy of dialogues which include the Sophist and the Statesman. This is an important reminder, for in those three dialogues Plato takes his stand in the confrontation between the two great 'schools' of philosophy, that of Heraclitus and that of Parmenides. Bartlett has a number of insightful observations about the dramatic features of this dialogue, which again show the painstaking care in his reading. He makes the general point that the question which unifies this dialogue -what is knowledge?- raises both epistemological and political issues: for it may upset those who have a claim on knowledge, poets and soothsayers, as well as the ordinary people who have the presumption to know. Bartlett believes that "the most important such rival to the philosopher's claim to knowledge, according to Plato, is the political community as a whole" (p. 115). The dramatic date of the Theaetetus is 399 BCE, just before Socrates' trial, which looms large in the entire discussion. Bartlett is completely right in arguing that the dramatic context of the dialogue, characterized by the impeding trial and execution of Socrates, is a warning sign that something more than a theoretical question is here at stake: the inquiry into knowledge is a more general inquiry into the philosophical life and its place in the city.

Bartlett follows very closely the development of the dialogue and the different attempts at defining knowledge produced by the young Theaetetus. When he states that "knowledge is perception" (Th. 151e), Socrates maintains that this was Protagoras' position, only differently put. This leads to an examination of Protagoras' famous saying that "man is the measure of all things" (or 'the human being' as Bartlett correctly translates it). Bartlett explores the nuances of Socrates' discussion of Protagoras' statement to his conclusion of utter relativism: every perception is true for the perceiving agent. Here Bartlett finds the turning point in the dialogue, when Socrates brings in the issue of false perception by people who are dreaming or insane (Th. 157e). To a baffled Theaetetus, Socrates demonstrates that the equation of knowledge with perception is wrong, regardless of its charm: for it is surely flattering to assume that one's ideas are infallibly true and that each man is the measure of his own wisdom (p. 163).

Bartlett then goes over Protagoras' long speech (Th. 162d ff), what is often referred to as the 'Apology of Protagoras', pronounced by Socrates. This is undoubtedly the most interesting section of the dialogue, for Plato makes a genuine effort to understand and give accurate expression to Protagoras' elaborate view of knowledge and all its consequences. Bartlett closely follows Socrates' arguments and concludes that they clearly show that Protagoras' position is self-refuting. He finds Socrates' best response to Protagoras embodied in his portrait of the philosopher as the closest approximation to god (the invitation to assimilate oneself to god as much as it is possible for a human being is heeded by the philosopher in the highest degree), and of god as "the deepest ground of the goodness of justice" (p. 196). Thus, Bartlett concludes, through his philosophy Socrates has been able to postulate a stable world accessible to the human mind, where objective knowledge and values are present.

I believe that at this stage the many merits of Bartlett's textual analysis and, in general, of his investigation of the intellectual relation between Socrates and Protagoras are apparent. He is right in identifying in Protagoras one of Socrates' most formidable intellectual opponents and he provides a fairly convincing portrait of the great sophist. From his investigation it emerges clearly that Plato respected Protagoras as a thinker and engaged with his ideas throughout his life, a treatment which was not given to other sophists such as Prodicus and Hippias, who are all but ridiculed. While agreeing with this picture, I would have pressed even more the issue of Plato's obvious and consistent interest for Protagoras' thought. This interest shows not only in the two dialogues under consideration, but also in other works where it is evident that Plato is trying to elaborate an answer to Protagoras' notion that "man is the measure of all things". As Bartlett correctly understood it, this notion does not apply only to knowledge but also to morality and politics and its consequence is cultural relativism: what is good and what is just vary from city to city, from age to age. Plato's dissatisfaction with this view and his tentative answer are already present in the remark, in the Republic, that "nothing imperfect is the measure of anything" (VI, 504c). His final answer is in the statement in the Laws that "god is for us the measure of all things in the highest degree" (IV, 716c). The resonances are too obvious to be casual.

I believe that we should press the investigation even further. Bartlett accepts too readily the idea that Protagoras' position, in its extreme relativism, is self-refuting. In fact, Protagoras does not deprive us of a standard for judging different opinions. After all, if all opinions were equally true and worthy, why would someone spend a fortune to study with him and learn his opinion? Protagoras obviously believes in the existence of wisdom and of wise men: everything is at it appears to every percipient subject, so all opinions are true for those who hold them; but some of these opinions are better, although not truer; they work better in practice. For instance, what is just is the opinion of the city (Th. 167c) but some opinions are obviously better than others, as we can judge from the fact that some cities thrive and others falter or are on the brink of destruction (see Thucydides for examples).

Protagoras' position is refined because he holds a 'pragmatic' notion of truth. He is a relativist in his theory of knowledge, but he believes in the superiority of expertise when it comes to practical matters: when we are sick we look for the physician, not for the assembly-goer! In a Protagorean perspective, the physician's opinion is not 'truer' than any other's but it works better, it heals the patient. And this applies also in the realm of morality and politics, where the goodness of a policy is judged by the results. The sophist, as the possessor of expertise, becomes the educator of human beings and cities alike, as Protagoras rightly boasts. Incidentally, it is my view that Protagoras' stand on knowledge was instrumental in Plato's development of his theory of ideas: the 'forms' are the best answer to the problem of objective foundation of knowledge posed by Protagoras. To conclude, Protagoras' position was unacceptable for Plato, who was looking for an objective standard by which he could measure moral beliefs, political arrangements and, obviously, claims to knowledge. The vision of the philosopher in the Theaetetus is the first step on that path.

My occasional points of criticism aim simply at showing how engaging Bartlett's reading of these texts is and how sophisticated is his general argument. Even if the readers may sometimes disagree with his conclusions, they will surely benefit from the insightful arguments he produces. The care this book requires in reading is well rewarded by the profusion of stimulating observations it contains.