Sound Sentiments: Integrity in the Emotions

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David Pugmire, Sound Sentiments: Integrity in the Emotions, Oxford University Press, 2005, 232pp, $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199276897.

Reviewed by Ronald de Sousa, University of Toronto


On the opening page of this engaging book, David Pugmire offers an analogy between emotional capacity and the soundness of a bell:

A bell … can be struck in a timely way and with suitable care (or not). It can ring out, ring true; its peal can have clarity, depth, resonance, and it can ring in harmony with other bells (or not) (1).

True to that metaphor, Sound Sentiments includes a convincing vindication of the notion of emotional depth; it proposes a sense in which emotions can be more or less "true," and shows how their resonance can be corrupted by misleading social harmonies. And against the widespread notion that, short of egregious dysfunction, anything goes in matters emotional, it offers a serious normative critique of emotional life.

Pugmire is a moralist. He aims to expose emotional "foibles," lodging in the now rarely probed interstices between merely optional variants and recognized pathologies. Foibles, as distinct from pathological states, "involve (or require) the will"; hence "it makes sense to describe these attitudes partly in normative terms, … as it does not with pathologies" (24). But beyond a generally Aristotelian flavor, the framework for assessing emotions does not rest on any explicit general theory of human nature. It is grounded, first, in an interesting defense of the idea of profundity in emotion.

Some occasions of emotions are intrinsically unsuited to trigger profound emotions. "'He felt it deeply!', said of his consternation as rain came while he was polishing his car, seems inescapably ironic" (31). Some emotion types, on the other hand, are intrinsically deep. One can't be just "a touch ecstatic" (31). What recommends profundity is that "life open to deep emotion is lived more fully" (33). But depth is not merely a matter of intensity. Indeed, intensity in itself is not necessarily desirable: there is a "temptation to regard the fact that one is feeling deeply about something as a justification … and this can be misguided" (32).

On Pugmire's analysis, the main tests of emotional profundity are belief, feeling, embeddedness, import, and truth. The first excludes emotions grounded in mere imagination or surmise (yet can't one be profoundly afraid without being sure of what?). Second, belief is not enough: there can perhaps be emotion without much feeling but it can't be profound unless it's strongly felt.Third, embeddedness is the emotional analogue of the degree of centrality in the web of belief which replaces, for Quine, the on/off distinction between what is necessary and what is contingent. "Thus, for instance, if I can't trust even my most proved friend, then I can't trust other friends either and if not them then no one. ('Et tu, Brute?')" (40). Fourth, if concerns, however intense or deeply embedded, lack import, -- like the "microcosms of the pusillanimous" -- they can never give rise to profound emotion (45).

This fourth requirement is really a special case of the fifth, which looks outside the individual subject, to an external, objective truth: "for profundity, the world must answer to what the person thinks about it" (51). That is a compelling and yet difficult notion, and I'm not sure Pugmire gets it quite right, as emerges from his consideration of some putative counter-examples. Can premonitory emotions be profound, for example, even if what they "announce" never materializes? Pugmire thinks they can, but only given a proviso: "[E]verything must be to the greatest extent as if the emotive eventuality will occur and have at least the gravity now imputed to it" (52). But that formulation seems to invoke a condition of justification rather than truth. Compare belief: if everything I can be expected to observe is as if it were true, I'm not culpable for being taken in, but my belief may still be false.

Religion has Pugmire squirming a bit. He's too polite to point out that since no religious tenet goes uncontradicted by the equally firm certitudes of some other sect, we can be quite sure that virtually all religious convictions fail the requirement of justification, let alone of truth. But Pugmire is conciliatory: "If truth of belief were needed, the fear of hell … could never be a profound fear … not only to the histrionic modern televangelist but also to the most reflective of medieval Christians. And that seems either false or merely stipulative" (53). That seems right, but again "truth" relates to no more than available reasons in context. It admits of degrees, which are more at home in the domain of justification than of truth.

Othello's jealousy is shallow despite its intensity, and despite having "something like embeddedness" in virtue of "its power to dislocate Othello's previous economy of thought and feeling" (57). Again, what profundity seems to demand is reasonableness in context. The world being what it is, Othello's jealousy can't be justified. So it can't be profound. If Othello's plight is tragic (Desdemona's, surely, is merely pathetic), then an emotion can be tragic without being profound. That may seem counterintuitive. But then maybe tragedy never really resides in the plight of the protagonist, but in the vision of the playwright. At the hand of a Shakespeare, the stuff of tabloid news makes tragedy (Romeo and Juliet), or farce (Pyramus and Thisbe).

Attenuated though it may be, the requirement of "truth" or objective adequacy rightly plays a crucial role in the identification of some of the foibles that are the topic of Pugmire's subsequent chapters, particularly sentimentality, cynicism, and narcissism. The "iconification" of Anne Frank, for example, illustrates the falsehood inherent in sentimentality. There are fears and hints of despair to be found in her actual diary. These are true to her real situation. But there is only unreal comfort to be had from the continued cheerfulness in the face of impending disaster sentimentally imputed to her by fictionalized accounts. In sentimentality, emotion is cultivated for its own sake rather than as a genuine response to the world. Thus "emotion becomes a drug" (125).

There is a sense in which my emotions always concern me; but narcissism begins where there is "a shift from an attitude of concern primarily with a thing as it strikes one to a concern primarily with one's attitude of concern for that thing" (107). This can lead to the "subversion of a person's relation to others" (109). In diverting attention from the event to himself, the narcissist also tends to undermine others' sympathy: "Admiration for someone who admires himself reverses polarity" (111).

Unlike sentimentality, narcissism also has a pathological variety recognized in the Diagnostic and Statistical Manual of Mental Disorders (fourth ed., 1994). But are there sufficiently robust differentia that distinguish the two kinds? Pugmire writes that "the emotions of the humdrum narcissist do, again, share the same surface structure of those of the pathological narcissist, and his relations with other people are, if less fraught, similarly opaque emotionally" (116). That makes it look like a matter of degree. Where and how should we draw the line? How should we apply the test of whether the will is involved? One might get either kind of narcissist to deplore his own narcissism, but only in the most self-indulgent, feckless, and narcissistic way. Whatever the will is, it's not clear that it can be influenced by the "partly normative" considerations that might be brought against narcissism.

Narcissism does, however, give rise to a possibility that illustrates one of Pugmire's most interesting ideas. He suggests that narcissism could turn into a virtue, given a certain sort of world -- which, coincidentally, happens to looks remarkably like a caricature of our own:

What people are in virtue of their belonging to or participation in common forms of life matters less and less to them … . Freedom comes to be valued to the extent that the very fact that something is one's own freely reached choice is enough to justify it. Relations with others are chiefly instrumental (or at least impulsive) … . No values acknowledged by oneself with others have any authority over one's choices, … . Being the focus of others' attention matters, but being the object of their judgment does not" (116).

Pugmire's larger idea is that our range of emotional capacities, not merely our actual emotions, is conditioned by our social context. "Society is as much a crucible of emotions as is personality. Perhaps in a given kind of world, only certain kinds of emotional life are likely, or even possible" (5). In itself, this is not a novel proposition. But it has the startling consequence that the cultivation of extreme individualism of the sort he describes might actually result in a constriction of the range of emotional possibilities. Yet the impulse to communicate or (less voluntarily) express emotions is part of the emotions themselves, and would be frustrated in that world. On that basis, Pugmire concludes, it would be "wrong to imagine that self-referring emotions would be innocuous, indeed advantageous, in a culture based on disengaged individualism. The position is rather that such a culture could not for long suit anyone living in it" (120).

But what exactly is involved in the claim that it would not "suit anyone"? This last pronouncement is characteristic of a note of distaste for our current culture, which occasionally seeps to the surface of Pugmire's lapidary prose. Among the targets of his scorn are such modern precautions as "the prenuptial contract," which strives to manage emotion by emulating corporate culture in the private domain (8), or kissing between acquaintances that will "turn the most casual encounter into an apotheosis of amity" (145). There's a raised eyebrow over the stiff upper lip from which drips a verdict such as the following:

"More and more mattresses are needed to shield the princess from that pea. The result will tend to be a life that is episodic, blissfully solitary, well appointed, anodyne, and long" (8).

This stance of disapproval opens out in what is in some ways Pugmire's most interesting but also his least satisfactory chapter, on emotional conflict and ambivalence. It is here that Pugmire is at his most moralistic. Ambivalence, the nurturing of contrary emotions, shows lack of whole-heartedness. "There is a sense, partly normative, in which the heart is indivisible" (172). There are two problems with this idea.

The first problem lurks in that stealthy parenthetical "partly normative." Pugmire's strictures against sentimentality, narcissism, and cynicism -- "sentimentality's shadow" (145) -- are based on the claim that they undermine emotional life and social connection. And about those conditions the claim makes good sense. But the charge is far less plausible when directed against ambivalence. One might, as Amélie Rorty recently argued in an unpublished lecture on "The Ethics of Ambivalence," insist that only a rich dose of ambivalence can preserve us from dangerous certainties and the comforts of prejudiced emotions.1 "Wholeness" sounds good, but it can keep us from the exploration of unseen facets and alternative points of view. Of course Pugmire doesn't deny this, but he claims that this is appropriate only for "incipient reactions, … nascent arousals" (181). In the end, the two sides of an ambivalent state can't be "consolidated," at least outside of the aesthetic context in which the prospect of action is put in abeyance.

I'm not sure the dispute admits of rational solution. It may be one of those areas where opinion is determined less by argument than by philosophical and emotional temperament. For the ironist, whole-heartedness will always seem phony; for those whose passions are entire, the ironist will always seem shallow. But what can be said is that Pugmire's argument is technically faulty. Like Plato in the Republic IV, he notes that one "cannot both do something and not do it" (182), and infers that "the heart is indivisible." From precisely the same observation, Plato drew the opposite conclusion: that the soul has separate parts. That should make us suspicious. In fact both Plato and Pugmire commit the same double fallacy.

First, emotions, like desires, are not actions. At best they involve dispositions to action. But dispositions to contrary actions are not necessarily incompatible. Two dispositions, expressed in conditionals that have contrary consequents, are incapable of being actualized together. But they may still coexist, particularly if their antecedents cannot or merely will not come to be true at the same time. Odi et amo means I could just as soon kill you as kiss you, but it's compatible with my doing neither.

The second fallacy is that emotions are, at least sometimes, intentional states. Notoriously, intentional states are not necessarily infected by the commitments of their contents -- reference, truth value, or contrariety. Those who concede that it's impossible to believe 'p and not-p' sometimes allow that one might simultaneously both believe p and believe not-p. As for desire, suppose q entails not-p. Then clearly I can't have all I want if I want both p and q, but that doesn't entail that there's anything wrong with my desire. On a reasonably realist view of value to which Pugmire seems to be sympathetic, desire is defective only if it is for something that is not truly worthy. But there could be clear value in both p and q: just not commensurable values.

Insofar as emotions are reducible neither to belief nor to desire, their case is murkier still. This is the source of the second, more general problem with Pugmire's normative claim. It is extremely difficult to set out, without circularity, criteria of contrariety for emotions. One might agree that emotions are contrary if they can't be whole-heartedly felt together; but insofar as this is a "conceptual rather than psychological" claim (181), it seems tautological. Pugmire is well aware that emotions don't straightforwardly inherit contrariety from the propositions embedded in them. But then what exactly is it that confers "a degree of systematic order to the fabric of the emotional life"? (170). And whence, in particular, come these relations of contrariety? Our feel for what feelings are liable to chase one another out doesn't go much beyond phenomenology, and that may vary from one subject to another. If so, the tut-tutting about ambivalence is out of place.

These reservations should not obscure my admiration for this book. It is subtle, original, invigoratingly opinionated, and, as I hope my quotations have illustrated, stylishly written. It is a fine contribution to the literature on the moral psychology of emotions, and deserves to be widely read.

1 See also Rorty, Amélie O., "Integrity: political not psychological," in Integrity in the private and public domains, ed. Alan Montefiore and David Vines, London: Routledge (1999) pp. 108-120.