Sovereignty and Its Other: Toward the Dejustification of Violence

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Dimitris Vardoulakis, Sovereignty and Its Other: Toward the Dejustification of Violence, Fordham University Press, 2013, 269pp., $26.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780823251360.

Reviewed by Nick Mansfield, Macquarie University


Climate change will remake -- has already re-made -- global politics. No issue will be more at stake in this period of change than sovereignty. Sovereignty haunts climate change debates in two key ways: how does an international system of negotiation defined in terms of the sovereignty of autonomous states deal with effects that know nothing of national boundaries? The other key issue in relation to sovereignty is the way different fractions of the population will suffer disproportionately the effects of climate change, to the point of their exclusion as determined by the sovereign logic of exceptionality outlined in Agamben's adaptation of Carl Schmitt. So, sovereignty is again a live issue for our times. The trouble, of course, evident from even this small sample of two constructions of sovereignty, is that the term means many different things, or rather, it operates on many different scales: sometimes referring to the constitutional rigidities of an established, authoritative regime; at others, something much more local, having to do with the petty and dismissive ways in which individual subjects are manipulated in the biopolitical order. A more extreme, and again, very different theorisation of sovereignty emerges in Bataille, where the self-destructive and ultimately religious drive of the human towards continuity with the universe produces a lust for the absolute freedom of self-overcoming and self-extinction, which Bataille understands as sovereign.

These constructions of sovereignty are not worlds apart, of course, and relate to one another in key ways, but their relationship is not always obvious, and since they are often deployed in different discourses -- from the legal through the activist to the poetic -- their familial nature is not much attended to. This means the energy, horizons and scope of the debates we need to have on sovereignty are pretty limited just at the time when we need to be thinking inventively and expansively about the issue. One of the great things about Dimitris Vardoulakis's new book on sovereignty and its uneasy relationship with its other, democracy, is that it represents just the kind of attempt to see sovereignty whole that we need. It does not deal with every configuration of sovereignty. If it did, it would be a completely different kind of book, useful in its own way, but more modest. Vardoulakis's achievement here is to provide a way of synthesising constructions of sovereignty into a single account that covers several thousand years of Western political thought. The book is not a compendium on sovereignty, nor a genealogy, but an ambitious and cogent essay that allows the big picture to emerge of sovereign legitimation as it has been deployed in different guises for centuries.

Vardoulakis sees sovereignty as emerging in three key moments: the ancient, modern and contemporary/biopolitical. Each of these deployments of sovereignty represents a different relationship between means and ends. In ancient sovereignty, in Augustine's City of God, for example, it is the justification of ends that takes priority through the eschatological drive towards the establishment of a kingdom of peace on earth. In modern sovereignty, in Machiavelli for example, the emphasis is on the justification of means. Power operates in order to advance power. Under biopolitics, sovereignty ceases to be simply a top-down deployment of political power and becomes the way in which even the most local forms of life are subject to rule according to the logic of the exception.

For Vardoulakis, however, what is absolutely crucial is not just the different ways in which sovereignty is identified in terms of various constructions of the relationship between means and ends. His key argument develops from the account of how each of these versions of sovereignty subtends a certain violence and then justifies that violence by simply identifying its own system of law with justice, by insisting that the relationship between its laws and justice is simple and unproblematic, thus licensing the use of violence in service to the regime's own ends. In contrast but not contradistinction to sovereignty is democracy, which in its most authentic form is agonistic, the open-ended contention of different voices in their responsibility towards the polis. For Vardoulakis, democracy incorporates an open-ness or responsiveness to the other. This open-ness complicates the relationship between law and justice. By opening on the other, democracy opens and re-opens perpetually the aporetic relationship between law and justice. Justice does not simply justify law under democracy. It problematises it, because in democracy's open-ness on the other by way of its open-ended agonism, the simple, convergent dynamic of justification cannot ever be absolute. Justification cannot close the gap between law and justice. In Vardoulakis's account, the severing of the simple relationship between law and justice is called judgement. Judgement makes justification impossible, or chimerical at least, ideological.

So, what allows democracy to resist sovereignty is its agonism, which is the result of the irreducibility of otherness. At a crucial point in his argument, Vardoulakis connects this openness in democracy with Derrida's "democracy-to-come," the interminable open-ness on its own improvement and enlargement that democracy both always brings and further awaits (202). It is here that I would like to raise one point of debate with the account Vardoulakis provides. He readily admits that sovereignty cannot simply be eschewed, and that democracy and sovereignty are inter-twined with one another in complicated ways. Still, their relationship is seen as uneasy. The agonism of democracy is preferable to the violence of sovereignty, which it displaces. Even when this concession is made, sovereignty seems to be something suspect if not anathema. This reflects a trend in most post-structuralist political thinking, where power is always treated as somehow alien, to be met only with suspicion and scepticism. On the theoretical left, power is no longer something to seize, but something to dissent from, subvert and critique. Ironically, its foreign-ness is only compounded by the fact that it is everywhere. It is part of our strangeness to ourselves, something we must concede as inevitable, but that we do not embrace. Sovereignty becomes inverted. Instead of the discourse of legitimacy, it becomes simply the pretext for unaccountable power. Of course, the history of sovereignty offers much we would want to dissent from, but at the same time, it is often only by inventing new sovereignties, or claiming to recover lost sovereignties, that so much significant political change has become possible. In other words, we cannot be simply sceptical about sovereignty, nor see it as something inevitable but unpalatable. We need a double discourse of sovereignty, in which it is both a source of serious danger but also the possibility of freedom.

This is where the connection with Derrida becomes important. Democracy-to-come provides us with the idea of a more open, more just and more free polity. Yet, because it is unlivable and unreachable, in fact, impossible, it orients the polis towards that which cannot be known or measured, the possibility of infinite change, of establishment on the way to disestablishment and so on, indefinitely. Democracy-to-come attunes any instituted political system to its greatest possibility of improvement and disaster, the opportunity of both perfection and explosion.

This opening of democracy on its possibility is the very opening onto the other that Vardoulakis sees as the meaning of democracy. In Derrida, however, the opening on the other is also the opening on the unsignifiable, impossible domain of an open-ended freedom. It is the opening on the unconditional that both stabilises and legitimates identity and order, but only by reference to that which both undermines and renews them. In Derrida's late work (specifically Rogues: Two Essays on Reason) the name for this unconditionality is sovereignty. In Derrida, sovereign identity and order only arise in relation to another, limitless unconditional sovereignty, and it is to this sovereignty that democracy-to-come reaches in its open-ness to otherness. In short, democracy does not challenge sovereignty with the possibility of an otherness sovereignty tries to quash. The very opening of democracy on otherness is sovereign, and it is by way of this open-ness that the throwing off of illegitimate and undemocratic regimes becomes possible. This is why it is to sovereignty that democratic and anti-colonial revolutions always appeal.

My argument is simply that the relationship between sovereignty and democracy may not be so morally and politically simple. Without sovereignty there may be no possibility of democracy. The era of climate change, in which the well-being of both the whole human population, and vulnerable fractions of populations, are at stake, will need more than ever before a full and informed discourse on the relationship between political power, and who that power is responsible to and determined by. In other words, our political debates must be about the relationship between sovereignty and democracy. What we need in this debate is the wide perspective of, and a purposeful scrutiny on, the long history of this relationship. What we need is more books like Sovereignty and Its Other.