Space, Geometry, and Kant's Transcendental Deduction of the Categories

Placeholder book cover

Thomas C. Vinci, Space, Geometry, and Kant's Transcendental Deduction of the Categories, Oxford University Press, 2015, 251pp., $78.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199381166.

Reviewed by Jeffrey L. Wilson, Loyola Marymount University


Thomas C. Vinci's book is a deep and densely argued contribution to the debate in Kant scholarship between conceptualism and nonconceptualism, the position that there can be no perception for Kant without the influence of the categories and the alternative position that there can be such perception. The territory upon which Vinci adjudicates this debate is the Transcendental Deduction, and he develops the toolkit for interpreting the Deduction by a careful and insightful new analysis of Kant's transcendental exposition of space and the role of geometry within it.

Beginning with a prelude on Leibniz's argument for the best possible world, Vinci sets out to answer the question, "Why [for Kant] should subjectively optimal conditions of (theoretical) thinking have an exact correlate in objective reality?" (3). That they do is a doctrine Vinci calls nomic prescriptivism, which he distinguishes from transcendental idealism. Nomic prescriptivism is a form of idealism (but not yet transcendental idealism) in which "empirical objects are made by the understanding to obey the laws they in fact obey" (85) or in which "the understanding prescribes intellectual conditions to the world" (175). Answering the question why the subjective conditions of thinking should be manifested in objective reality involves a new analysis of the Transcendental Deduction of the Categories in both A and B editions of the Critique of Pure Reason (CPR), which according to Vinci has a proof structure not recognized by previous commentators.

Chapter 1 argues that Kant's theory of space as the a priori form of outer intuition and as itself a formal intuition corresponds to a container view of space (stemming from Hans Vaihinger), according to which previously unordered sensations become ordered by being located within the container (space) that preexists the sensations. Two alternative views are Patricia Kitcher's interpretation of forms as mechanisms (i.e., sets of rules of ordering sensations) and Lorne Falkenstein's treatment of forms as relations among sensations. Vinci rather swiftly dispenses with both alternative views by arguing that the forms-as-mechanisms hypothesis is inconsistent with "the passivity of the faculty of receptivity" (12) and that the forms-as-relations view fails to account for space as preexisting in the mind since it would appear to be ontologically dependent on the sensations that the forms would be relating to one another. However, it is highly doubtful that receptivity is passive for Kant as Vinci claims. Indeed, the receptivity-spontaneity distinction very likely does not correspond to an activity-passivity relation on the parts of sensibility and understanding. Kant has arguably chosen the word receptivity precisely to avoid the misapprehension that receptivity is passive. Vinci himself quotes CPR B160-61n., in which Kant explicitly asserts that the unity of space as a formal intuition "presupposes a synthesis." If space as receptive involves this activity of synthesis, Vinci's assertion that receptivity is passive is unwarranted, his critique of Kitcher is undermined, and the forms-as-mechanisms view remains a live option. At the same time, it is not clear that rejecting the superiority of the container view would lead to a rejection of the book's main insights.

Vinci proceeds to distinguish the representation of local space from that of global space, where the former applies to a single perceptive act and its empirical intuitions, and the latter applies to the space of all perceptive acts in general. He identifies space as a container as local space, leaving global space as the rule under which different local spaces are topologically ordered into a unitary space. This move is puzzling since space in the global sense was presumably the space to be accounted for by the forms-as-mechanisms and the forms-as-relations accounts Vinci argues against and indeed by Vaihinger's version of the forms-as-container view that Vinci supports. Vinci thus insufficiently distinguishes his view of global space from both the forms-as-mechanisms interpretation and the forms-as-relations thesis; the forms-as-container view of local space would appear to be an addendum to those views rather than an alternative to them. These problems make the argument of Chapter 1 less forceful and more suggestive than probative. His final move here is to argue for the container view on the basis that constructing the three dimensions of local space requires a prior three-dimensional global spatial container.

The distinction between local and global space is operative in the arguments of Chapter 2. Here, he attempts to show, through an interpretation of the early paragraphs of the transcendental exposition of the concept of space against the background of the Prolegomena, that the impossibility of deriving space through an abstraction from experience is a premise toward the conclusion that our representation of space is a pure intuition. It has often been taken to be the case that the latter proposition is a premise for an argument leading to the former. Vinci develops his account in dialogue with Lucy Allais' interpretation, which he rejects on the ground that she does not sufficiently distinguish the intuited local pure form of empirical objects in which their representations are contained from an understanding of space as the global form of intuition which provides the rule for the construction of local spaces into a topologically unified space. In the first two chapters, it does not become entirely clear how the distinction between global and local space, the latter of which is to be accounted for by Vinci's special reading of the container view, help to shed light on previously obscure aspects of Kant's arguments. The reader may experience some frustration in these early chapters caused by not understanding why these complex distinctions are necessary.

Chapter 3 maintains with Richard Aquila that Kant's objects of intuition should be read as intentional objects in Franz Brentano's sense. On this hypothesis, spatio-temporal objects become vehicles of intentionality. These objects are mind-dependent and yet the cognitive states corresponding to them intend objects separate from the mind. (It would be clearer to say that they intend mind-independent things, although it must be granted that Kant uses the term "objects" promiscuously to refer either to objects of appearance or things in themselves, an ambiguity that can only be resolved by attention to the context.) Vinci develops a projectionist account of intuition-representations in which the form must be spatial in order for the objects of these representations to be themselves spatial. Projectionism entails that for Kant empirical intuitions (along with their form) must be distinguished from intuitions in general, or in Vinci's words that "properties of the structure of intuitions themselves are projected onto the intentional objects of intuitions" (225). Here again, Vinci's interpretation runs counter to the standard interpretation in which intuitions in general would be read as including both empirical intuitions and pure intuitions such as mathematical constructions, without giving clear grounds for this departure until much later. He develops an analogy with a geographical map in order to motivate his account. In the analogy, intuitions in general correspond to symbols on the map, whereas the blank space in which the map is constructed represents pure intuitions of local spaces. For this reviewer, the map analogy does not quite succeed in its purpose of clarifying the distinction between local and global space. Vinci ends Chapter 3 by recognizing that our global representation of a topologically unified space requires a synthesis, thus adding an active (though noncategorial) element to receptivity.

Vinci uses Chapter 4 for an extended exploration of Kant's theory of geometry and the ways in which he uses the example of geometry in defense of transcendental idealism. The account of geometry is developed in conjunction with Philip Kitcher's interpretation and over against those of James Van Cleve, Michael Friedman and Wayne Waxman. It is beyond the scope of a review to go into the details of the debate here. Vinci's unfolding of it is exhaustive as regards the English-language commentators and seeks to clarify especially the relation of pure to applied geometry. The chapter could stand on its own as a significant contribution to Kant's philosophy of mathematics. Suffice it to say that the purpose of the foray into geometry is to develop the main point of the book, to demonstrate that the proof structure of the Transcendental Deduction is parallel to that of the argument from geometry. The parallel promises to shed new light on the Deduction.

Chapter 5 ventures into the A Deduction and the concept of the affinity of the manifold that is central to it but absent from the Deduction in the B edition. Vinci argues here that the main task of the Deduction is to establish nomic prescriptivism. He draws from Karl Ameriks his insight about the parallelism of argument structure between the exposition of space and the Deduction but parts company when it comes to Ameriks' claim that both arguments are regressive.

In Chapter 6, Vinci explicitly wades into the recent debate over whether Kant's account of intuition is conceptualist or nonconceptualist, i.e., whether the influence of the categories begins after intuition has occurred or goes "all the way down" to the original acts of perception. Vinci's helpful proposal is that we can find a middle way that allows for Kant to be both conceptualist and nonconceptualist by recognizing that there are two kinds of synthetic activity that can unify intuitions. There is a category-governed synthesis that leads to logically unified intuitions that produce objective judgments or judgments of experience. Likewise, there is a non-categorial synthesis that produces nonobjective judgments (aesthetically unified intuitions that correspond to Kant's "judgments of perception" from the Prolegomena). The existence of this latter type of synthesis and judgment means that intuitions can be present to the mind without the operation of the categories. Most conceptualists would claim that this position puts Vinci squarely in the camp of the nonconceptualists; nevertheless, he does show how both positions can be motivated in a nonexclusive way by a new reading of Kant's texts. He finds this via media through an analysis of the early sections of the transcendental deduction in the light of the Prolegomena and the Jäsche Logic accounts of empirical concept formation, and of empirical schematism. Vinci develops his novel position here in conversation with Wilfrid Sellars, Jill Buroker and Béatrice Longuenesse, among others. The book will perhaps be most interesting to those who are participating in or at least following the conceptualist-nonconceptualist debate, especially those who suspect that a false dichotomy may be operative in it.

Whereas Vinci has implied earlier that nomic prescriptivism is a limited position that is not yet transcendental idealism, he confusingly says here in Chapter 6 that nomic prescriptivism depends on transcendental idealism. It would seem from his earlier comments that the dependence relationship should be the other way around. There is also material for confusion in Vinci's use of the terms connection synthesis and combination synthesis, which by his arguments should be identified with aesthetic unification and logical unification, but he does not explicitly juxtapose these terms. Greater terminological consistency would lend greater clarity in the case of distinctions of terms that carry multiple names.

Chapter 7 reveals two main claims. The first is that Kant's expression "intuitions in general" should not be read as including empirical intuitions. If correct, this claim would explain why Kant needs a second part to the B Deduction. If empirical intuitions are included under intuitions in general, then once Kant has proven that intuitions in general come under the categories, it would be trivially true that empirical intuitions also fall under the categories. But if, as Vinci argues, empirical intuitions are separate from the special class of intuitions in general, there would be a nontrivial reason for the second part of the B Deduction. The second main claim of this chapter is that Kant's argument for nomic prescriptivism in the deduction has a structure that is parallel to Kant's argument from geometry for transcendental idealism from the transcendental aesthetic. In the course of the chapter, Vinci argues (against most commentators) that the unity of self-consciousness is not identical to the unity of apperception. He sees the unity of apperception as belonging to the unity of space and time in perception, while the unity of self-consciousness is the unity of a subject of judgments as they apply to objects in space and time. The unity of self-consciousness would thus be correlated with the synthesis Vinci has explored earlier of spatial objects within a unified topological space, while the unity of apperception would apply to the unity of objective consciousness under the categories. While the unity of self-consciousness would thus be required for the aesthetic unification of perceptions, only the unity of apperception would be required for logical unification of objects. In this way, Kant's transcendental exposition of space provides the model for the argument structure of the transcendental deduction. Vinci ends his book by showing how the need to distinguish reality from illusion motivates some important differences between the A and B deductions.

In the end, Vinci has produced a masterful exploration that is, nevertheless, not entirely satisfying or persuasive. Despite giving extended and original interpretations of space, geometry, and the Transcendental Deduction, the arguments connecting these interpretations with one another go by all too quickly. Most readers will find that they want more robust explanations for these connections than he provides. In this way, the chief virtues of the book may be different from those the author envisioned. While Vinci proposes to show how the proof structure of the Transcendental Deduction resonates with the argument from geometry, his primary -- and very substantial -- contributions are to give a deep new analysis of Kant's theory of geometry, provide a novel interpretation of the relation between self-consciousness and apperception and most of all to offer a moderating and mediating voice in the conceptualist-nonconceptualist debate. For these reasons, his book is very much worth reading and engaging.